Rationality and Religious Commitment

Placeholder book cover

Robert Audi, Rationality and Religious Commitment, Oxford University Press, 2011, 311pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609574.

Reviewed by Bryan Frances, Fordham University


This book is about the rationality of religious commitment. So, we need to know what the author means by those two terms. In Part I, Audi tells us about several notions of rationality (45 pp). In Part II, he tells us what religious commitment is. In Part III, he tells us how such commitment is related to morality and human flourishing. In Part IV, we get his arguments that the religious commitments he has talked about are rational in some of the senses he has talked about in the face of objections.

In Godfather II, Michael Corleone remarks that his father Vito taught him to "keep your friends close, but your enemies closer". In this book, Audi has enemies: people who say religious commitment is irrational. After studying this book, I wonder whether Audi hasn't kept his enemies close enough, as he may have misunderstood the worrisome epistemic complaints against religious commitment. He seems to have picked out notions of rationality that are meager and then pointlessly argued that religious commitments are rational in those senses. He is aware that the problem might occur: he writes in chapter 1 that one of his goals is "to provide a framework for understanding rationality that is neither too stringent nor too permissive" (22). Nevertheless, I think he fell prey to the latter threat, which diminished the value of a good portion of the book: since he didn't articulate a notion of rationality that generated a worthwhile philosophical thesis, there wasn't much point in arguing that religious commitment satisfies that notion.

The charge of irrationality applied to religious commitment could come from any of several distinct groups: philosophy professors; people like Richard Dawkins, Christopher Hitchens, Paul Zachary Myers, and Sam Harris, who have serious intellectual but little or no philosophical training; intelligent non-theists with little intellectual training at all; or atheists who foam at the mouth on blogs and in bars. Different groups bring significantly different charges under the heading 'irrational'. I'm going to assume Audi was assessing the charge from philosophy professors (see the first page of his preface), as they will make up almost all of his readers (most of the book would be incomprehensible to almost anyone outside of philosophy).

I suspect that the majority of philosophers will be happy to admit that there is a fairly robust and common notion of rationality according to which millions of ordinary people have rational religious beliefs and other religious commitments. By 'religious belief' I mean beliefs that make some substantive claim and are part of some religion, such as 'God exists', 'Jesus rose from the dead', 'Heaven exists and is everlasting', etc. By saying that the belief is 'rational' I mean that, at the very least, charges such as 'You should know better than to believe that', 'You are being foolish', and 'You aren't living up to your own cognitive standards -- ones you do in fact live up to most of the time' don't apply to the person in virtue of her having the religious belief. Very briefly, if one grows up in a social-epistemic environment with certain key features (e.g., everyone has just about the same religious beliefs, it's been that way for many years, the society functions pretty well when it comes to practical matters, etc.), the rationality of theistic belief can be easily had. Furthermore, philosophers are happy to list some of the factors that very often help make those religious beliefs rational:

1. Testimony for the beliefs

2. Ignorance of significant challenges to the beliefs

3. Testimony that any challenges are mistaken or frivolous

4. Plausible arguments for the beliefs (even if those arguments have fatal flaws that can't be repaired)

5. Ignorance of serious flaws in those arguments

6. Extraordinary experiences that are commonly classified as religious

7. Ignorance of good reasons to be skeptical of the idea that those experiences are indicative of the truth of religious beliefs.

Even if one thinks that there is nothing like 'objective evidence' for those religious beliefs, one can readily admit that millions of religious commitments are rational in the above sense. Given all that, what is Audi claiming for the rationality of religious commitment?

In Part I, he talks about three main notions of rationality that apply to beliefs: "minimal", "consonance with reason", and "reasonableness". Minimal rationality is something like being in possession of your cognitive faculties to the extent that you don't need to be institutionalized (30). If you've been in an accident in which you suffered a serious brain injury, then you might not be in such possession for a time (6). Audi says that this minimal rationality applies to persons, actions, and beliefs.

So to say that religious commitment is "minimally rational" is to say nothing remotely interesting: everyone will agree that there are minimally rational people whose religious commitment is minimally rational. I know many of them.

A little higher on the scale of epistemic goodness is "consonance with reason", which has a wide range of epistemic goodness from "perceptibly better than minimally rational to optimally reasonable" (7). Alternatively, it's the "area between minimal rationality at the lower limit and rational requiredness at the upper limit" (16). The two characterizations suggest that rational requiredness equals optimal reasonability.

I can't imagine there is any question whether religious commitments are "consonant with reason", since that status is satisfied with a status merely "perceptibly better than" minimal rationality -- which means you're doing perceptibly better than someone who needs to be institutionalized. So consonance with reason cannot be the kind of rationality that we are looking for when wondering whether religious commitments are "rational" in any sense that will be of interest to philosophers.

Another of Audi's notions of epistemic goodness is reasonableness: a belief has this status when it is "easily" consonant with reason (32). Given that minimal consonance with reason is defined as merely perceptibly better than minimal rational, a belief is "reasonable" in Audi's sense when it is "easily" perceptibly better than minimally rational. It is hard to know what this amounts to, as the qualifier 'easily' is pretty vague. Perhaps it means something like this: the belief is significantly epistemically superior to a minimally rational one. But what does that mean?

Perhaps as a way of helping the reader figure out what being "easily perceptibly better than minimally rational" comes to, Audi says that such a belief need not be "overall justified" or "amply justified", where the latter are achievement notions (25): usually, if a true belief is "overall justified" then that's all it takes for it to amount to knowledge (29).

Thus, he is saying that a "reasonable" belief -- one that is "easily perceptibly better than minimally rational" -- need not be overall justified. He thinks this epistemic status is important:

My strategy in this book is to consider whether religious commitment can be rational, particularly in [1] the sense in which rationality is consonance with reason, and then to pursue the questions whether, given the grounds on which it may be rational, [2] it is also reasonable (44).

So one of the book's theses, (1), is that religious beliefs are "consonant with reason". But we already saw above that such a thesis is of no interest, as the bar for consonance with reason is so low and it's just not at all philosophically controversial whether religious beliefs ever reach that bar. The other thesis mentioned in the excerpt, (2), is stronger: religious beliefs are "reasonable", meaning "easily perceptibly better than minimally rational but perhaps not overall justified". But why would philosophers be interested in that thesis, which says that some religious beliefs are "easily" better than no-need-for-institutionalization but might be unjustified?

Perhaps as an answer to that question, Audi says that if you become convinced that someone's belief is reasonable in his sense, then that belief merits your respect (33), but as far as I could tell he didn't tell us what that amounted to. In a sense, we respect the belief in Santa Claus had by a four-year-old child. I also respect, in a sense, grossly racist attitudes: even a quite intelligent person could, under the influence of ignorance and massive racist testimony, be completely reasonable in having those attitudes. He also says that if religious commitments merit respect, then this fact is "highly significant" (34). But is it? How significant is it that some religious beliefs merit our respect because they are easily better than no-need-for-institutionalization but perhaps unjustified? By my lights, this is granted by nearly everyone and has no great significance.

Audi thinks that appraising people's religious commitments shouldn't focus on overall justification, as that's too stringent:

To require justification, then, at least of the full-blooded kind that comes to mind when we think of people as successfully justifying their positions, as a minimum standard of rational acceptability, is to take a more stringent position than is appropriate for an adequate appraisal of persons and their [religious] commitments (34).

In a sense, it's easy to agree with him, especially given his insertion of "as a minimum standard of rational acceptability": it is worthwhile in some contexts (e.g., faced with a class of undergraduates) to point out that there are some notions of rationality, easily above need-not-be-institutionalized but perhaps unjustified, that religious commitments satisfy. This might be news to some people, but I doubt that many of those people will be philosophers. For my part, and I doubt whether I'm alone in this view, I think it is "appropriate" to inquire whether there are justified substantive religious beliefs -- where 'justified' indicates something roughly equivalent to what needs to be added to true belief to make it knowledge.

I'm not saying that philosophers never offer philosophically interesting accusations that much religious belief is irrational. My sense is that those who make such charges are usually focused on (a) highly educated people, (b) justification, or (c) sustaining of belief via irrational means such as mental illness, wishful thinking, fear (e.g., of the unknown), groupthink, the strong tendency for obedience, and the often unconscious desire for comforting worldviews. That is, philosophers argue that a large subset of certain educated people have only irrational religious beliefs, that religious beliefs are unjustified even when rational, and much ordinary religious belief is sustained via irrational means.

I doubt whether (c) itself is philosophically controversial (for one thing, you could say the same thing about many political and moral beliefs that happen to be held by many millions of people), but (c) generates a philosophically interesting thesis (d): since much religious belief is based on testimony, much of that testimony involves at some points in the testimonial chain the irrational means just mentioned, and "it seems clear that . . . a testimonial chain can be no stronger than its weakest link" (37), and much testimony is epistemically weak in a way tied to justification.

With regard to (a), consider the list of seven factors given near the beginning of this essay that often help prop up the rationality of much religious belief. If one is highly educated -- like a professional philosopher -- then in a great many cases (2), (5), and (7) are no longer applicable. A philosopher could easily be tempted by the rough yet philosophically worthwhile thesis that without those three factors, many religious beliefs end up irrational in the sense suggested by phrases such as 'You should know better than to believe that', 'You are being foolish', and 'You aren't living up to your own cognitive standards -- ones you do in fact live up to most of the time'.

If I'm right about the philosophically uninteresting nature of Audi's notions of rationality, then much of his book loses its interest. Since most philosophers will be interested in the 'rationality' part of his book's title, I have discussed that notion at length, thereby omitting discussion of 'religious commitment', the other half of the title. But I would be remiss to fail to indicate the richness of some other parts of the book! His discussion of many kinds of faith and their relations to one another (chapter 3) was illuminating, particularly his discussion of the kinds of rationality that might apply to various kinds of faith. Similarly, his description of the many components of religious commitment (chapters 4 and 6) was similarly instructive in a descriptive manner: although there are good reasons for focusing on belief, religious commitment includes a great deal more that is philosophically interesting.

The final two chapters of the book take up the problem of evil and the challenge of naturalism. I will comment just briefly on the former. Lara Buchak's October 2012 book review in the International Journal for Philosophy of Religion addresses the latter.

Audi's main idea here is that when figuring out whether certain bad things are good evidence against the idea of an omni-creator, we need to factor in not just the standard kinds of goods and evils that are found in the creation, but God's experiences, too. Perhaps there is some incalculably great positive value in God's experience of the fawn who is burned to death in the forest fire. Of course, this makes God look callous: he derives high positive value from the fawn's burning? More important, what about the fawn: shouldn't she get the good connected to her suffering? Audi is aware of that demand (232-39). His response is complicated but involves appeal to an afterlife -- a good one, of course, that somehow counterbalances the fawn's suffering. Naturally, many will object: (a) why think there is an afterlife for fawns? (b) why think there is a great afterlife for fawns? (c) why think that her suffering was needed in order for her to be compensated in that great afterlife?

But keep in mind Audi's goal in this part of the book: show that a theist can be "easily perceptibly better than minimally rational" in sticking to her religious commitments even when aware of the problem of evil. If a theist is aware of the challenge of evil, hears a sophisticated theistic-friendly response to the challenge, and yet is blamelessly unaware of the fatal defects of that response (assuming there are such fatal defects), then I think she could easily be "reasonable" in sticking with her religious commitments even if the fatal flaws are there.