Rationality and Religious Theism

Placeholder book cover

Joshua L. Golding, Rationality and Religious Theism, Ashgate, 2003, 142pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 07546 15685

Reviewed by Jacob Ross Tel-Aviv University, Tel-Aviv University


This new book may be said to constitute a very interesting attempt to act in accordance with the slogan "religion is what it does." But whereas the social anthropologists who invented this slogan (which summarizes the approach that is known to them as "Functionalism") were interested in different matters, Joshua Golding has here produced a very good, clear and well-argued presentation that is purely philosophical. In place of the hoary-old philosophical debate whether it is rational to believe certain propositions about God's existence and nature, which largely centered around the familiar so-called "proofs" of God's existence, Golding proposes that we concentrate on the question whether it is rational to be religious theists. For him religious theists are those who live a religious way of life. They seek a good relationship with God, in whom they, at least minimally, believe; i.e. they are committed to the belief that there is a live possibility that there is a God. They must also believe that the religious way they follow promotes the probability that if there is a God they will attain the special relation to God which they seek, and the obtaining of which they regard as supremely valuable.

Given this pragmatic approach to rationality, it is not surprising that Golding devotes the more technical part (section 1.2) of Chapter 1 of the four chapters of his book to a summary of Blaise Pascal's famous Wager-argument for the instrumental rationality of the belief in God. He intimates that a revised version of this argument will form the basis of his own defence of the rationality of accepting religious theism and explains (section 1.3) his motivation (rational beings should make rational choices, and "having a rationale in hand may crystallize and strengthen his commitment") for providing such a defence. In Chapter 2 Golding carefully explains the conceptions, beliefs and actions entailed in being a religious theist, as opposed to simply believing in God. In Chapter 3, the most lengthy chapter in the book, he first (sections 3.2 – 3.4) meticulously sets out the constraints relating to the conceptions of God (the Supreme Person), the good relation (union or special reward or interpersonal bond) to God, and the religious way (spiritual activities such as contemplation, meditation, prayer, as well as practical activities such as moral behavior, study and good deeds). Then (sections 3.5 – 3.6) he explains what is meant by the belief in the live possibility of God's existence and the belief that following a certain religious way will promote the good relationship with God. All this leads up to the argument set out in detail in section 3.7 of Chapter 3, that by substituting "living a religious life" in place of "believing in God" we can circumvent some of the known weaknesses of Pascal's position. This is so because, unlike the intellectual belief in the existence of God (where one could remain "agnostically" uninterested in the whole matter), adopting or rejecting a possible way of life may truly be something 'forced' upon a person in particular circumstances as a decision that one cannot escape. Hence the revised version of the argument involved in Pascal's wager does not recommend a belief in God per se, but rather recommends the pursuit of a good relationship with God even in the face of uncertainty as to whether God exists. Nor is there any room for the accusation that there is something impious in pretending to believe solely out of a desire for self-interest or self-gain, as has been argued in criticism of Pascal's original Wager argument. In the revised version believing propositions is regarded as less important than acting religiously. So there is no turpitude involved in choosing to live a valuable life which may provide a sense of purpose and direction which a non-committed way of life may lack.

It should have been clear, as Joshua Golding expressly acknowledges from the start, that this whole conception serves him as the basis of his own defence of the rationality of his being an observant Orthodox Jew. This is so inasmuch as the observance of the mitzvoth (i.e. the "commandments") of the Torah on a constant daily basis is a very prominent feature of the traditional Jewish way of life. In Chapter 4 of the book he sets out the application of this concept of "being a religious theist" to Judaism in detail (sections 4.1 – 4.7) and, in this reviewer's opinion, does so quite well (though I have certain reservations which I shall air on some other occasion).

However Golding goes on (in section 4.8) to reflections regarding religious pluralism, and comes to the surprising conclusion that other religions (such as Christianity, Islam, certain versions of Hinduism, or even non-theistic religions like Taoism and Buddhism) could be rationally defended in similar ways for other sets of believers, insofar as these religions involve particular ways of life as well as religious doctrines that may be live options for them. It is just at this point that one begins to suspect that Golding's arguments have led him to generalize too widely. While a good case may be made for the defence he offers for his own Jewish observance, there is something implausible in extending the revised Pascalian Wager-argument to the practice of other religions where doctrinal belief is more central than it is in Judaism. It may true that Buddhism, Taoism and certain versions of Hinduism each share an insistence on a particular way of life for which they preach and which, for each, characterizes their individual form of religiosity or their notions of the spiritual to be sought by their followers. For them it would then be plausible to suggest a rational defence of their "ways of life" that is similar to what Golding has suggested for Judaism. But most forms of Christianity stress the creed and insist that salvation depends upon faith or the right intellectual beliefs. The variety of different Christian churches in different countries leads one to suspect that there is no single distinctive Christian way of life other than the confession of the creeds and religious prayers, ceremonies and practices of the Christian churches alone. Even if there is a common core to all of these, this together with the insistence on moral uprightness, universal justice and other such values would constitute a much thinner "way of life" that is much closer to the secular way of life lived by secular humanists than the thick "way of life" which comes to mind when we consider the manifold activities, laws and customs involved in being a religiously observant traditional Jew.

For this reason it is possible to raise the question whether it matters very much what the Jew must believe in order be a religious Jew. In section 4.5 of the book Golding considers this question as discussed by contemporary observant orthodox thinkers. After quoting the radical view of Menachem Kellner, who says there is no formulated creed at all that is required of a religious Jew nowadays, as opposed to the more traditional view which is maintained by J.David Bleich who supports the 13 principles formulated by Maimonides in the 12th century, Golding adopts a middle position. This, he believes, is reflected in his view of the minimal belief in the possibility of the Personal God and the more confident belief that the observance of the commandments of the Torah is the right way for achieving the special relation of intimacy (devekut) with God that brings man's true happiness. The fact that he is satisfied with minimal belief in the possibility indicates his departure from Maimonides, who thought that God's existence could be proven. But since this intimacy is, according to Maimonides again, a form of knowledge, and the effort to attain knowledge of God is part of the goal of keeping the Torah according to Golding as well (even though he interprets this as a matter of seeking to replace his minimal belief by something more robust, whereas Maimonides interpreted the search for knowledge in a neo-Platonic manner), the departure from the Maimonidean tradition may be regarded as itself partially reconcilable.

Golding's effort to base his approach to Judaism on the stress given to the religious way of life, as opposed to mere intellectual belief, fits in well with a trend characteristic of many intellectual Jewish thinkers in the modern period. Ever since Moses Mendelssohn in the late 18th century, traditional Jews have sought to regard the observance of the commandments as the essential aspect of Judaism, leaving intellectual doctrines as secondary. In the 20th century, many thinkers – notoriously Yeshayahu Leibowitz – have sought to lessen their dependence on the more doctrinal traditions of Judaism, restricting their religion to the observance of the commandments while regarding the traditions of Jewish thought in its midrashic and medieval forms as a non-binding corpus from which they might select items by choice. In this respect they have become what has been called "orthoprax" Jews rather than "orthodox" Jews, even though their daily Jewish way of life is impeccably orthodox-like. An increasingly growing group of younger intellectuals who are observers of the tradition maintain theological views that are decidedly non-traditional.

I am not sure just where Joshua Golding stands on these matters. A difficulty in interpreting the precise nature of his position stems from the fact that he has chosen to write his book well within the "scholastic" style of the analytic philosophers of religion attached to the Christian faith, particularly some leading Calvinists such as Plantinga. This accounts for his stress on "theism" and "religious theism". It is worth pointing out that many of the younger observant Jews stressing orthopraxy as central might find Golding's insistence on talking of religious "theism" somewhat restrictive, since they themselves are prone to supporting more mystical trends in traditional Jewish thought which go well beyond theism narrowly considered. From the Appendix at the end of Golding's book one gains the impression that he too might be interested in more panentheistic traditional conceptions which have found many supporters, even in the most orthodox of Jewish circles.

Nonetheless, Golding's book is to be welcomed as a sincere attempt to formulate his Judaism in a clear and philosophically exact terminology. It deserves to be widely read even by those who find his analytical "Christian"-like manner of presentation not entirely to their taste.