Rationality + Consciousness = Free Will

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David Hodgson, Rationality + Consciousness = Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2012, 267pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199845309.

Reviewed by Justin A. Capes, Florida State University


In Rationality + Consciousness = Free Will, David Hodgson, a recently retired Judge of Appeal of the New South Wales Supreme Court, contends that attention to the nature of human rationality and consciousness and their role in belief formation and action production supports a variety of libertarianism about free will and moral responsibility.[1] In Hodgson's opinion, although what we believe and do is significantly influenced by our genes, unconscious neural processes, and other environmental factors in accordance with laws of nature, these factors and the laws governing them do not completely determine our beliefs and actions. This does not render our behavior random, however, for in many ordinary cases at least our actions are an appropriate and rational response to the circumstances with which we are faced. In these respects, Hodgson's position is not terribly different from many extant libertarian accounts of free will. In other respects, however, including the route he takes to his preferred brand of libertarianism, the view he develops is rather distinctive.

One distinctive feature of Hodgson's account emerges early on. It is his view that we make free decisions not only about what to do but also about what to believe. He points out that we often engage in what he calls "plausible reasoning." This happens when we reach a conclusion based on evidence which supports but does not entail the conclusion. In such cases we do not start with indubitable premises which we then plug into an algorithm which in turn generates the correct answer. Rather, we are confronted with various facts, some of which support the conclusion, some of which do not, and we must make a decision about what to believe or do based on the limited evidence available to us at the time.

A clear example of plausible reasoning contributing to decisions about what to believe, Hodgson claims, is one with which he is intimately acquainted, viz., a judge having to make a decision about a case based on inconclusive or conflicting evidence. In situations like this, he says, "The conflicting considerations are inconclusive and of different kinds, and there is no way in which a judge can overtly apply precise rules of formal reasoning to them in such a way as to determine a conclusion. And yet, I contend, reasonable albeit fallible decisions are made" (p. 38).

This feature of Hodgson's account is opposed to a widely held view according to which belief formation is largely passive. On one version of this opposing view, although we may have indirect voluntary control over what we believe -- e.g., by having direct control over which bits of evidence we consider -- which belief we arrive at after having taken these active steps is typically not a matter of choice. Rather, having considered the reasons at hand, we simply find ourselves arriving at certain beliefs. Unfortunately, Hodgson doesn't mention such opposing positions, and it is not clear why we should prefer his view to plausible alternatives like the one just adumbrated.

It seems that even when we are not aware of decisive reasons favoring a certain belief or course of action, our decisions about what to believe or do could nevertheless be deterministically caused (e.g., by unconscious processes in our brain). However, Hodgson rejects this possibility. He maintains that attention to certain features of conscious experience strongly suggests that consciousness operates indeterministically in the production of our beliefs and actions.

A central feature of conscious experience, Hodgson says, is that it allows us to grasp a myriad of various individual pieces of information combined as wholes or gestalts to which we then respond in deciding what to believe or do. However, in Hodgson's opinion, the feature-rich gestalts of conscious experiences to which we respond "generally do not as wholes engage with laws or rules of any kind, but can nevertheless as wholes have a causal influence because subjects of experience can respond appositely to them" (p. 80). Hodgson's argument for this claim is complex, but here is the gist of it. According to him, laws of nature only engage with quantitative features of things and must be sufficiently general. However, he insists that feature-rich gestalts of conscious experience, such as complex visual experiences, have causally efficacious features that are not quantitative in nature and thus are not governed by laws or rules of any kind, and that in any event these gestalts are typically tooindividualized to engage with general laws of nature.

I found this part of Hodgson's picture a bit puzzling. Why must laws of nature be too general to engage with unique, feature-rich gestalts of conscious experience? And, even if we grant that non-quantitative features of these gestalts can be causally efficacious, why couldn't there be deterministic laws of nature pertaining to non-quantitative features of events and states of affairs? As far as I can tell, these are questions Hodgson does not address. Without answers to them, however, it is far from clear that our responses to feature-rich gestalts in deciding what to believe and do could not be deterministically caused.

Hodgson is concerned to show that his views about plausible reasoning and the role of consciousness in belief formation and action production are consistent with what science tells us about the world and in particular about the workings of the human brain. He acknowledges that there are laws of nature that constrain what can exist and what can happen. However, he rejects a deterministic picture according to which laws of nature together with past events and states of affairs precisely determine every outcome. In his opinion, although laws of nature constrain what can happen, they typically leave open a spectrum of possible outcomes, and which outcome results is not something that is always fixed in advance. He claims support for indeterminism of this sort from quantum mechanics. Of course, it is possible that indeterminism of the sort that may be operative at the quantum level does not occur in the human brain and that the production of beliefs and intentional actions is entirely deterministic. However, Hodgson argues that it has not been shown that the operations of the brain cannot be affected by quantum indeterminism. He concludes that current scientific theory is consistent with his picture of human freedom and responsibility.

According to Hodgson, his account of how plausible reasoning and consciousness contribute to decision-making supports

the view that human beings make decisions as to what to believe and what to do that are not pre-determined by prior conditions and laws of nature, yet are not random but are apposite responses to circumstances facing them; so that these decisions can be both indeterministic and rational (p. 153).

Such decisions, he claims, are genuine exercises of free will and thus are things for which we can legitimately be held morally accountable. Moreover, he contends that free decisions do not require any special sort of agent-causation distinct from causation by events involving the agent, nor are they uncaused. The resulting view is thus a brand of event-causal libertarianism. According to event-causal libertarians, free actions are indeterministically caused by prior states and events and in particular by mental states and events such as beliefs, desires, intentions, and, in Hodgson's opinion, agents' conscious grasp of feature-rich gestalts.

Hodgson attempts to distinguish his view from other event-causal libertarian views that have been put forward in recent years, in particular that of Robert Kane.[2] One important difference, he says, is that "Kane focuses on decisions about what to do, whereas I link free will with plausible reasoning about what to believe, as well as other decisions about what to do" (p. 161). But in his opinion, the most significant difference between the two theories is "the absence [in Kane's work] of a developed account of how the choice between alternatives is made, from the experiential perspective," such that the choice is not arbitrary. "My approach," Hodgson claims,

fills this gap. It says that in making this kind of choice, the agent is responding appositely to reasons which do not operate by engagement with laws or rules, so that the outcome is rational although not determined by the engagement of existing circumstances or rules. The selection is not arbitrary, because the conflicting reasons do not merely support each alternative between which a choice is to be made, but operate in the selection itself by way of the agent's apposite non-rule-determined response to them. (p. 162)

But I fail to see how these remarks show Hodgson's view to be an improvement on similar accounts like Kane's. Event-causal libertarians such as Kane are typically happy to acknowledge that when a person acts freely the person is responding to reasons that do not deterministically cause the person's actions. Moreover, they are keen to insist, as is Hodgson, that actions which are not deterministically caused needn't be random, since in ordinary cases at least they are (or are the result of) the agent's indeterministically caused response to pertinent reasons. The features of Hodgson's view identified in the quoted passage thus do not clearly distinguish it from other event-causal versions of libertarianism. Moreover, even if Hodgson's view is an improvement on the likes of Kane's, there is a related worry which he fails to adequately address.

An important challenge to indeterministic theories of freedom and responsibility of the sort Hodgson favors features the notion of chance or luck. The basic worry is that if the world is indeterministic and if events, including human actions, are not deterministically caused, then whether the events in question occur or not seems to be a matter of chance or luck. But if whether someone performs a certain action or not is a matter of luck, it is hard to see how the agent could have sufficient control over his behavior for it to count as free or for it to be something for which the person could be morally responsible. In the eyes of many, worries of this general sort are among the most serious conceptual challenges to indeterministic theories of free will and moral responsibility. But Hodgson's brief response to them is problematic.

According to Hodgson, the sorts of worries about chance or luck thought to threaten indeterministic accounts of freedom and responsibility challenge

the possibility that . . . it is the person's rational choice whether to do action A or action B that determines the outcome. In effect they assert that . . . the state of the universe immediately prior to the exercise of free will is not causally sufficient to bring about just one out of action A and action B; and that this suggests that which of them occurs in any replay cannot be due to the agent's rational choice. (p. 178)

But this is a misunderstanding of the (alleged) problem. The worry is not, as Hodgson seems to suggest, that if our actions are not deterministically caused, then they are not due to our rational choices. The worry, rather, is that if our choices themselves (or, as Hodgson sometimes puts it, our selections between alternatives) are not deterministically caused, and thus are not deterministically caused by relevant features of us as agents, then whether we make those particular choices or not is (at least partly) a matter of luck, in which case many find it hard to see how our choices or the overt behavior stemming from them could be genuine exercises of free will of the sort that could ground moral responsibility. Hodgson does not address versions of the problem of luck along these lines, and thus leaves one of the most pressing challenges to libertarian accounts of free will unanswered.

In addition to his treatment of free will and moral responsibility, Hodgson also weighs in on a number of other issues, including moral realism, truth, belief in the external world, punishment, aesthetics, life's meaning, and religion. Indeed, of the book's twelve chapters, no less than four (along with substantial sections of others and two appendices) are devoted to issues that are at best tangentially related to his account of free will. In chapter 1, Hodgson begins with a Cartesian-like set of reflections on his most fundamental beliefs. In chapter 2, he briefly sets out a version of the correspondence theory of truth and defends the claim that, at least in many instances, humans have sufficient rationality to make informed, albeit fallible, decisions about what to believe and do against what he perceives as an attack on that claim from various quarters. Chapter 10 contains a brief defense of moral realism, a rejection of consequentialism, and a sketch of Hodgson's preferred moral theory, which appears to be a brand of pluralistic deontology. The role of retributivist principles in justifying and administering legal punishment is the subject of chapter 11. In chapter 12, Hodgson shares his views on issues ranging from whether life has any purpose, to the possibility of an afterlife, to the rationality of belief in a god. The book concludes with two appendices, one on Bayes's Theorem and another railing against biblical fundamentalism.

Hodgson has clearly read widely and displays an impressive breadth of knowledge about a variety of subjects including philosophy, physics, psychology, and legal theory. There is, however, a worry that he sacrifices precision and depth for breadth. Although he covers a lot of territory in the book, readers may find themselves wishing for fewer overviews of the relevant literature and more substantive and careful engagement with that literature. That said, theorists concerned with the role of consciousness in human judgment and action production or in event-causal libertarianism will no doubt find much of interest in Hodgson's latest book.

[1] In metaphysics, libertarianism is the conjunction of the following two theses: (1) we sometimes act freely and are morally responsible for at least some of what we do, and (2) causal determinism is incompatible with free will and moral responsibility.

[2] See, e.g., Kane's book The Significance of Free Will (New York: Oxford University Press, 1996).