Rationality in Action

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Searle, John, Rationality in Action, MIT Press, xvi + 303 pp, $35. 00 (hbk), ISBN 0-262-19463-5

Reviewed by Raimo Tuomela, University of Helsinki


John Searle’s new book continues his philosophical project which has previously produced books in the fields of speech act theory, philosophy of mind and action and the construction of social reality. The present book is his most comprehensive and detailed book in the philosophy of action.

Listing the chapter titles is one way of giving a quick description of the contents of the book: 1) The Classical Model of Rationality and Its Weaknesses, 2) The Basic Structure of Intentionality, Action, and Meaning, 3) The Gap: Of Time and the Self, 4) The Logical Structure of Reasons, 5) Some Special Features of Practical Reason: Strong Altruism as a Logical Requirement, 6) How We Create Desire-independent Reasons for Action, 7) Weakness of Will, 8) Why There is no Deductive Logic of Practical Reason, 9) Consciousness, Free Action, and the Brain.

In the first chapter Searle defines a view of rationality that he opposes and discusses throughout the book. This view, called the Classical Model of Rationality, is defined in terms of the conjunction of six assumptions: 1. Actions, where rational, are caused by beliefs and desires; 2. Rationality is a matter of obeying rules, the special rules that make the distinction between rational and irrational thought and behavior; 3. Rationality is a separate cognitive faculty; 4. Apparent cases of weakness of will, what the Greeks called akrasia, can arise only in cases where there is something wrong with the psychological antecedents of the action; 5. Practical reason has to start with an inventory of the agent’s primary ends, including the agent’s goals and fundamental desires, objectives, and purposes; and these are not themselves subject to rational constraints; 6. The whole system works only if the set of primary desires is consistent.

Searle claims that all of these six postulates are untenable, and refuting them sets the stage for developing a better account. However, Searle’s enemy smacks of a straw man and I think he also presents many mistaken criticisms against it (e. g. concerning what it says about preferences or matters related to speech acts). I do not think that it, viz. the full view, has any proponents in current philosophy, although some of the postulates might still be acceptable in some corners (maybe half a century ago something like the Classical Model was to be taken more seriously). Today it is hard to find advocates of belief-desire psychology. In contrast, theoretical accounts of action are based on the BDI (belief-desire-intention) architecture, where intentions and commitments play a major role. Talk about belief-desire psychology and Humean selves as bundles of experiences that occupies Searle to some extent does not have much place in current philosophy of action. Because of this and the problem of space I will not here discuss the Classical Model but will concentrate on Searle’s positive account.

This book is vintage Searle, with the good (and less good) features that one is accustomed to find in his previous books. It is written in engaging style and is accessible to a wide audience, even if it is not perhaps meant for the layman. It contains lots of interesting arguments and some new things, especially the ideas about non-sufficient causation of action and a comprehensive account of reasons for action. The main contributions of the book are indeed about these two topics. Especially the account of reasons, and among them of desire-independent reasons, will probably be of lasting value in the philosophy of action.

I will below concentrate on a couple of topics that are central in the book. The first topic is causation of action. Briefly, the agent’s desires and beliefs do not cause the agent’s decisions and intentions - at least from the first person point of view (Searle’s standpoint until the last chapter). This is due to the agent’s free will: he is free to decide which desires and beliefs he will act on. This is the first “gap”. In Searle’s action theory an intentional action “normally” comes about due to an agent’s prior intention which leads causally, but not with necessitating causality, to action. The latter itself consists of the agent’s intention-in-action (“volitional” element) and the behavior caused by it. The second gap is that between the prior intention and the intention-in-action, and is dramatically exemplified by the phenomena of weakness of the will. The third gap is that between the initiated action and its completion. According to Searle, “ ’the gap’ is the general name that I have introduced for the phenomenon that we do not normally experience the stages of our deliberations and voluntary actions as having causally sufficient conditions or as setting causally sufficient conditions for the next stage” (p. 50). All of these gaps are familiar phenomena and have been extensively discussed in the literature.

If there is a piece of news here it is that there is only non-sufficient causation between the prior intention and the intention-in-action. I find this somewhat problematic (although my own view at the end is not far from this). Let me consider the matter briefly. I have taken the notions of agency and action to be primitive and, presumably, irreducible notions. An agent is viewed as a “substance” with two central “variables” (as far as the present problem is concerned). One is action, and the other one is the motivating reason for action. These things can vary while the agent itself is the substance in which these two kinds of changes can take place. Consider now a standard case of a successfully performed intentional action, X, by the agent, A (the following general formulation seems acceptable to all theorists of action): Agent A intentionally performed action X because of reason R. Here X could be opening the window and the reason R might under an externalistic construal be taken as the intended state of the room being ventilated given the believed causal connection that the room cannot become ventilated without the window being open.

Searle gives an externalist account of reasons, which I find generally acceptable. Let me speak of the partly reason-generated (total) motivational causal state (M) that can be taken to have caused the agent’s action (in Searle’s terminology: intention-in-action and the bodily behaviors caused by it). This motivational state contains desires, beliefs, possibly emotions, and, most importantly the agent’s intention to perform X (the agent is assumed to act on his desires and beliefs). While I acknowledge that the agent’s will is free and thus that his desires and beliefs do not cause the intention, here – as we are dealing with successful action – the gap is bridged by including the prior intention (to ventilate the room) in M. This is why I do not need to emphasize the role of the first gap. As to the second gap, the action X was indeed successfully performed and no weakness of will was involved. Thus in the present case the second gap became bridged. (Presently we need not worry about the third gap at all, because it has been stipulated to have been bridged here. ) Now we can adopt the outsider’s point of view and say that the “because” in the above action description concerning A’s action X is both normative (for conceptual reasons) and causal (because the action is something naturalistic and involves a chain of events). Now, seemingly contrary to Searle’s position, I say that in a sense the agent’s motivational state was in this particular case (in which the gaps had been bridged) a sufficient cause of the action. That is, there is this sense sufficient singular causation here (type-type causation may well be lacking, as, e. g., the possibility of the weakness of the will shows). In the present circumstances it is true that, had the agent not opened the window, he would not have intended to ventilate the room and to open the window.

This clearly seems to contradict Searle’s account. However, it must be noticed that what is at stake here is the agent’s taking the intended state that R expresses as his sufficient reason. To get to a claim of sufficient causation taking place within the agent we have to assume that the agent intentionally controls the situation. Loosely speaking, the causation took place against the background of an actively operating agent who “was in charge” (cf. also Searle, p. 66: “where free rational action is concerned, all effective reasons are made effective by the agent, insofar as he chooses which ones he will act on”). This blocks, e.g., the kind of compulsive behaviors that Searle considers and in which there is sufficient causation but no intentional causation. Sufficiency in the present case means just sufficient singular causal bringing about of an event. It is a different problem whether there is a type-type sufficiency here, e.g., a special psychological law saying in effect that a motivational state-kind M is causally sufficient X (an action kind) for all agents or at least for agent A assuming that the presence of akrasia is blocked by means of some condition. The kind of causation I am suggesting here could be called “agent-constrained” causality (I in my previous work called it “purposive causation”). Roughly, part of the intuitive picture here is that there is normal sufficient causation of A by M, and in routine-like (or “ingrained”) cases it does not require the agent’s intervention, but the agent still (intentionally and possibly unconsciously) monitors the situation so that things happen according the agent’s plan and thus the content of the prior intention. On the other hand, from another angle it can be said that there are lots of gaps in the course of intentional action, because things may go wrong at any point in the process beginning with the formation of the (prior) intention to the end result (e.g., the result event of the window becoming open). This is precisely what requires the agent’s constant monitoring of the situation, although the monitoring may be routine and partly unconscious.

My view of agent-constrained causation makes for a new alternative to the possibilities Searle considers as viable alternatives for solving the free will problem in Chapter 9, which considers matters from a third person point of view. There he is left with the combinations 1) psychological indeterminism and neurobiological determinism, and 2) psychological indeterminism and neurobiological indeterminism. What my idea, when worked out, would or might give is simply psychological determinism combined with either neurobiological determinism or, possibly, even with (mild, rather micro-level) neurobiological indeterminism.

Let me now briefly consider what I take to be Searle’s main contribution, viz. his account of reasons for action (p. 103): “All reasons are propositionally structured entities: they may be facts in the world such as the fact that it is raining, or they may be propositional intentional states such as my desire that I stay dry. They can also be propositionally structured entities that are neither facts nor intentional states, entities such as obligations, commitments, requirements, and needs. “ Reasons are defined more exactly on p. 133, and in that definition Searle requires that the agent, X, take the reason-stating set of statements, S, as not stating causally sufficient conditions for the performance of the action, A. I find this to be doubly problematic. First, an agent may carry his umbrella because he takes as his sufficient reason and cause for that to be that it is about to start raining (but cf. my earlier discussion related to this point). Secondly, the agent must be sophisticated enough to understand this kind of conceptual account -- surely it is too much to assume of children, who still may act for a reason.

Desire-independent reasons form an important class of reasons (which Searle claims are not open to, e.g., chimpanzees). In their case the reason is the ground of the desire, and the desire is not the ground for the reason (as, e.g., internalist accounts of reason would have it). For example, if an agent promises to do X, the recognition of this promise will generate his desire to obey it, but the reason (that he has made the promise) is the ground of the desire (even if the agent had desired to make the promise). Searle has many valuable -- but also problematic -- things to say about desire-independent reasons, but I cannot here go into detail except for making one somewhat critical remark, which concerns his proof of altruism.

Searle sets himself the following question in his discussion of altruism (p. 158): Are there rationally binding desire-independent altruistic reasons for action? I will not here go into details except for considering his proof of the existence of altruistic reasons, which I find not really wrong but somewhat misplaced. So consider Searle’s “linguistic” argument on pp. 161-2. The first step is this: I am in pain, so I say “I am in pain”. Because “pain” is a general term in language it has the same truth conditions for all persons. Next: my pain creates a need. So I say, “I need help because I am in pain”. Analogously with the first step this generalizes to “X needs help because X is in pain”, for any X. The third step gives us the following statement: “Because I am in pain and need help, you have a reason to help me”. Analogously, this generalizes to any persons X and Y.

Here we have an argument for a desire-independent reason to behave altruistically. Desire-independence comes from Searle’s assumption that pains and needs in general are such reasons. Searle says on p. 163 that the universality constraint that gets us from egoism to strong altruism is already built into the universality of language. But I think that the linguistic point is not the right point to make here. The real work in this argument is done by the claim that needs create desire-independent reasons. No “semantic ascent” is required to see how the argument goes. (A different issue is why we should think that needs can create reasons in interpersonal contexts, but I cannot here discuss this problem.) What is more, on p. 191 Searle says that “recognition of the validity of the reason is enough to guarantee that the person acts on the reason. So this either seems to make almost all of us altruists or, alternatively, the analysis employs a notion of recognition which is excessively strong.

On the whole, I can warmly recommend Searle’s book both to researchers in the field and to others interested in philosophical problems concerning rational agency. Searle is stimulating and provocative, but he also tries to argue for his own positive views and is in general successful. The book rather successfully shows how to combine naturalism with a full-blown view of human agency and the self. This can be regarded as a fine achievement.