Rawls and Religion

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Tom Bailey and Valentina Gentile (eds.), Rawls and Religion, Columbia University Press, 2015, 307pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231167994.

Reviewed by Jeremy Williams, University of Birmingham


One of the cornerstones of Rawls' political liberalism is its ideal of public reason, which places citizens under a moral requirement to justify their proposals for the imposition of coercion in mutually acceptable terms and thus to refrain (subject to certain qualifications) from appealing in political argument to the tenets of any unshared or sectarian 'comprehensive doctrine'. Gerald Gaus has depicted Rawls' political liberalism as a 'distinctively American political theory', displaying a 'prepossession with the political implications of theistic religious disagreement'.[1] Whether or not Gaus is right about that, the question of whether Rawls makes appropriate or excessive demands on religious believers in particular has certainly been an overriding preoccupation of the secondary literature on his later work. Given the sheer volume of existing writing, one might wonder how there could be more to say. This collection, however, contains fresh insights and the sense of a debate still continuing apace while providing a helpful and reasonably detailed guide to the story so far. It has, I think, plenty to offer to aficionados of, and newcomers to, the debate over Rawls and religion alike.

Rawls' pro-faith critics contend that excluding religious arguments from democratic deliberation is arbitrary (because they are, per se, no less accessible, and no more controversial, than some of the political arguments on which public reasoning depends), and that it is unfairly demanding because it requires religious citizens to alienate themselves from their deepest convictions. The essays in this volume take these objections seriously and engage with them sympathetically. Indeed, if I have a complaint about the volume as a whole, it is that it tilts a bit too far in this direction: the case for less, rather than more, religious inclusion in public life is not well represented. From the editors' introduction onwards, the most frequently-voiced defence of Rawls is that his model of public reason carves out ample room for religious justification in politics - more, indeed, than many expect. These defences of Rawls appeal in particular to his later, 'wide view' of public reason, under which comprehensive doctrines may be drawn on freely in political argument, subject to the 'proviso' that sufficient public reasons for the same conclusions be produced 'in due course'.[2] Rawls' critics, meanwhile, seek to amend or replace the wide view with an understanding of political civility that is more permissive still of religious political advocacy. It would have been welcome had the volume offered a greater, counterbalancing sense of what can be said in favour of a stricter, exclusivist public reason account and against Rawls' move to the wide view.


The book consists of ten contributions, divided into three parts: 'Reinterpreting Rawls on Religion' (which evaluates the case for Rawlsian restraint from religious citizens); 'Accommodating Religions with Rawls' (which addresses certain complexities regarding just what political liberalism expects and allows of the religious and those wishing to engage with their doctrines politically); and 'Transcending Rawls' (which considers political liberalism through the lenses of other religious and philosophical traditions). After a brief overview of the contents, I pick out a couple of essays for closer attention.

Part I includes most of the volume's best-known names: Christopher J. Eberle, Robert B. Talisse, Paul Weithman, and Andrew F. March. Eberle's chapter on 'Respect and War', discussed below, provides a strong start. Talisse takes on some of Eberle's previous work, making a forceful case to the effect that a broadly Rawlsian view does better at protecting religious conscience than Eberle's 'ideal of conscientious engagement'. Weithman offers a helpful summary of his important assurance-based reading of Rawls' rationale for adopting the wide view.[3] And March's careful essay (on which, again, more below) aims to supplement the Rawlsian position with more nuanced typologies of 'religious reasons' and 'political issues' and to explore their practical implications.

Part II is opened by Patrick Neal, who aims, like Talisse, to defend Rawls from the objection that he demands too much of religious citizens, though with less success, I thought. Neal's main strategy is to emphasise that political liberalism does not 'directly subordinate' people's comprehensive doctrines, in the sense of insisting that, from within those doctrines themselves, the political values of public reason are always of overriding moral weight. Rather, it leaves it to individuals to decide for themselves how (and indeed whether) their comprehensive and political commitments are to be reconciled. That, however, seems rather cold comfort to Rawls' religious critics, whose standard complaint is not that political liberalism second-guesses their doctrines but instead that it curtails their permissible options in political advocacy, and ability to resist laws that their consciences tell them are repugnant, should they find themselves unable to fully adjust to the demands of Rawlsian reasonableness.

Micah Schwartzman contributes a defence of the practice of 'reasoning from conjecture' - a form of non-public reasoning briefly described by Rawls, whereby 'we argue from what we believe, or conjecture, are other people's basic doctrines, and try to show them that, despite what they might think, they can still endorse a reasonable political conception that can provide a basis for public reasons.'[4] Schwartzman argues that reasoning from conjecture can be saved from objections to the effect that it is necessarily insincere or manipulative, culturally imperialist, or lacking in epistemic authority. This seems clearly correct. Indeed, the practice of taking up someone else's doctrine in order to show that it commits them to what one thinks it commits them to seems so innocuous that the fact that there are apparently significant qualms about it within the public reason fold may only underscore, for many skeptics of political liberalism, that the Rawlsian understanding of what respectfully navigating political disagreement involves rests on a mistake.

Johannes A. van der Ven's chapter -- a theological case for Christian conformity to the demands of political liberalism - closes Part II and segues neatly into Part III. The contributions here come from James Gledhill (on a quasi-religious notion of 'redemption' through community which Gledhill observes in Rawls and compares with ideas of community in Habermas and G.A. Cohen), Peter Jonkers (on Joseph Ratzinger's perspective on public reasoning), and Abdullahi A. An-Na'im (who contrasts his own Islamic defence of the secular state with political liberalism). These chapters lie further from the mainline debate over religion and public reason and may end up less often read exactly for that reason. They are, however, authoritative and informative and repay careful study.

Eberle on 'War and Respect'

Having surveyed the volume, let me comment further on Eberle's contribution. His intriguing strategy is to use just war theory as a foil for critiquing public reason liberalism, in both its Rawlsian 'consensus' and 'convergence' varieties. His objections to the former are, I believe, rather more successful than those to the latter.

Eberle's central case against the Rawlsian view is that its denial of justificatory status to religious and comprehensive arguments is ad hoc, given that those arguments are not necessarily more controversial or prone to reasonable doubt than the sort of arguments from political justice which make up the content of public reason. That objection -- often labeled the asymmetry objection -- is familiar. But Eberle gives it a new spin by illustrating it with the example of judgements about proportionality in war. Such judgements are notoriously messy, both philosophically (where we face a raft of difficult questions relating to which harms and benefits count and how heavily) and empirically (where it is contentious which evidence and predictive methods can be relied on in evaluating whether a war's effects are or would be proportionate). Yet, political liberalism nonetheless permits the state to invoke proportionality calculations to justify coercing its citizens into supporting a war. The example of proportionality, it seems to me, corroborates the asymmetry objection quite powerfully, though I'm less sure that it advances the ongoing debate over that objection, if only because it's not clear that it has features that aren't shared with other, more frequently-cited examples, such as judgements about the ethics and impacts of climate change and capital punishment.

Eberle next trains his sights on convergence liberalism -- the increasingly influential competitor to Rawlsian public reason developed by Gaus and Kevin Vallier. On the convergence view, coercion is permissible only if all reasonable citizens have sufficient reason to endorse it, factoring in not only the reasons they share with others but all the reasons they would still affirm after a respectable amount of good reasoning (as Gaus has it) or under moderate idealisation (as Vallier has it). Eberle takes convergence to be an improvement on the Rawlsian model, insofar as it grants religious citizens a veto over coercive measures that are incompatible with their convictions even when the balance of public reasons dictates in favour of their imposition. But he nonetheless rejects it, on grounds that it places excessive obstacles before the legitimate imposition of coercive law, jeopardising the state's ability to perform even basic functions. I share the suspicion that convergence is overly hostile to needed or morally mandatory coercion. Yet I'm not convinced that Eberle has shown this.

Eberle first invokes the example of the 'agapic pacifist', whose religion leads her to reject all war, even in self-defence. Given the presence of agapic pacifists, he contends, the state would not be permitted, under convergence, to coercively mobilise its citizens into a war effort even if national survival depended on it. Pace Eberle, however, the demands of convergence seem fully satisfied if the conscription of citizens' bodily services and resources is accompanied by a right of conscientious refusal since then nobody is subject to coercion that (s)he lacks sufficient reason to accept.[5] As Jeff McMahan has argued, it is dubious that a country that offered such exemptions would find its ability to fight significantly debilitated should it be subject to attack.[6] But conversely, as McMahan also suggests, allowing conscientious refusal should make it at least somewhat more difficult for countries to wage unjust expansionist wars, in which case it is welcome, at the bar of the just war tradition.

Eberle also argues that, since war represents the paradigmatic form of coercion, convergence implies that we may not attack others unless they have sufficient reason to accept our doing so. Yet, he continues, our enemies would rarely if ever have such reason. Instead,

Given their dependence on vastly different information and normative principles, the members of warring communities will often, and perhaps typically, be in a condition of what Vitoria called "invincible error" regarding the justice of the wars their community wages: they will wrongly evaluate the justice of the wars they fight no matter how responsibly and conscientiously they evaluate the available evidence. (pp. 46-7.)

Thus, Eberle concludes, the convergence conception implies pacifism in practice.

I again doubt that this objection strikes home, for several reasons. First, convergence requires only that coercion be justified to the reasonable, thus permitting violent responses to unreasonable aggression whether our enemies have reason to accept it or not. Second, pace Eberle, it is doubtful that, in most cases, soldiers will be unable to reason their way to the conclusion that their war is unjust -- invincible ignorance, while often pleaded, seems far from the norm. Third, even when soldiers truly cannot appreciate that their participation in war is unjust, they may have sufficient reason to accept a rule whereby morally innocent causal threats may be targeted. And fourth, even if that is not so, it may not be a blemish on the convergence view since it is a point of significant controversy within just war theory whether those who, for reasons including invincible ignorance, entirely lack moral responsibility for posing an unjust threat to others are indeed liable to attack.

Thus, while the convergence view may well restrain the pursuit of war, Eberle does not demonstrate that it does so unacceptably. Indeed, it may turn out to restrain it for the better, in a way that many just war theorists and religious citizens alike would endorse.

March on 'Rethinking the Public Use of Religious Reasons'

While Eberle repudiates public reason approaches altogether, March attempts to navigate a middle course between political liberalism and its 'inclusivist' religious critics, positioning himself as a public reason liberal who nonetheless believes that there is greater room than Rawls allows for religious argument in public life. His thesis is that Rawls' account is too undiscriminating because it fails to take stock of salient distinctions between types of religious argument and types of political issue, which can influence whether it is objectionable to bring the former to bear in debates over the latter. March unfolds these distinctions with insight and attention to detail. The result, however, is that the paper has a lot of moving parts. I was sometimes left unsure both why March takes his conceptual framework to yield certain conclusions about the permissibility of religious justification over others and how far the model's implications differ from those of Rawls' wide view.

For instance, among March's key claims is that a principled distinction can be drawn between religious arguments in support of social justice measures on the one hand and against homosexual rights or same-sex marriage on the other. The former, he thinks, are permissible, while the latter are not, even when both take the form of appeals to scriptural or clerical authority, and neither is accompanied by fulfilment of Rawls' 'proviso'.

The reason for the difference, March contends, is that these instances of political advocacy 'express quite distinct moral attitudes towards others as free and equal fellow citizens' (p. 116). To invoke some religious authority for purposes of coercively restraining consensual homosexual activity, March says, constitutes 'the clearest possible example of regarding other human beings as subject to one's own extrapolitical epistemic and moral authority' (p. 112). To invoke it for purposes of selectively denying same-sex couples marriage or partnership rights and access to the social goods that go with them likewise bespeaks an objectionably authoritarian attitude towards one's fellow citizens, albeit perhaps not to quite the same dramatic degree. But appeals to religious authority in support of, say, enacting universal healthcare have a different moral complexion, March submits. Crucial to their acceptability is the fact that they call on us merely to benefit our fellow citizens rather than some entity whose existence or status as an object of moral concern we might reasonably dispute, do not require 'demeaning or humiliating' sacrifices from benefactors, and do not involve promotion of interests in beneficiaries that are only recognised from within some 'sectarian' perspective (p. 115).

I have doubts about this conclusion. Suppose that, while debating social justice, certain non-religious citizens argue, using public reasons, that the right to material assistance ought to be dependent on lack of responsibility for one's need for aid. They object to being taxed more or deprived of material resources to which they think they have a stronger claim for the sake of those who made unwise choices. Suppose also, however, that other, religious citizens insist - purely on grounds of some scriptural decree - that the badly-off should instead be helped unconditionally. It seems correct that the latter do not treat their peers as quite so completely subject to their 'extrapolitical epistemic and moral authority' as if they were to press, with reference to the pronouncements of their religious authority, for the criminalisation of same-sex relations. Yet is what they do sufficiently unproblematic to be permissible from a public reason perspective,? After all, while they seek to benefit some citizens, they also seek to deny substantive goods and rights to others (comparably, indeed, to those who oppose same-sex legal partnerships on biblical grounds). And they also demand the coercion of those who fail to contribute as their religious authority dictates. Importantly, March does not say that appeals to religious authority in the context of social justice (when unaccompanied by public justifications) do not bespeak a theocratic or domineering attitude towards others but rather that they do so to a lesser degree (p. 115). Should we not conclude, then, that they are still wrong, if less so?

March goes on to argue that religious reasoning has a legitimate role to play in deliberations over issues concerning the protection of beings who are 'outside of the immediate political community' (p. 116). Strikingly, he includes abortion among these issues. I was again unconvinced that March's model yields this conclusion. He says (pp. 118-9) that religious advocacy on behalf of those outside the social contract is acceptable only on the condition that 'we accept that such entities have interests that ought to be protected' and 'there is no real dispute over what interests those entities have'. Yet, the moral-political controversy over abortion is, in large part, a controversy over precisely these questions. Some of March's remarks (e.g. at pp. 117 and 118) seem to indicate that he thinks that claims to the effect that fetuses have interests in continued life are not significantly philosophically controversial and are in that way unlike claims to the effect that spirits or deceased prophets, say, have a good to be promoted. But that is false, I believe, at any stage of pregnancy.[7]

It is unclear, then, that March's account successfully justifies two of the most eye-catching examples of non-Rawlsian religious advocacy that he envisages. Elsewhere, meanwhile, when March describes instances of what he takes to be acceptable religious justification (e.g. the case of an opponent of torture who supplies a religious rationale for her commitment to human rights), I was left wondering whether what he has in mind differs from what Rawls calls 'declaration' -- a form of justification permitted under the wide view, whereby citizens offer public reasons, while explaining the comprehensive grounds of their support for them.[8]

If March has difficulty departing from Rawls, this only goes to show what a long shadow the latter still casts over the debate over the place of religion in politics. In his 1998 interview with the Catholic magazine Commonweal, Rawls defended his political liberalism by asking, rhetorically, 'what's the alternative?'[9] As this volume amply attests, we will all be grappling with the challenge Rawls left behind for a long time to come.[10]

[1] Gerald Gaus, Contemporary Theories of Liberalism (London: Sage, 2003), p. 185.

[2] See John Rawls, Political Liberalism, Expanded Edition (New York: Columbia University Press, 2005), at p. 462.

[3] See his Why Political Liberalism? (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010).

[4] Rawls, Political Liberalism, pp. 465-6.

[5] On that point, see Kevin Vallier, Liberal Politics and Public Faith (New York: Routledge, 2014), pp. 133-4.

[6] See, e.g., his Killing in War (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009), p. 99 at circa.

[7] For the claim that arguments concerning fetal interests in continued life always take sides between controversial conceptions of the good, see my 'Public Reason and Prenatal Moral Status', Journal of Ethics 19 (2015): 23-52, at 38-40.

[8] Rawls, Political Liberalism, p. 465.

[9] John Rawls, Collected Papers, ed. Samuel Freeman (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 620.

[10] For helpful suggestions on this review, many thanks to Kevin Vallier.