Rawls Explained: From Fairness to Utopia

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Paul Voice, Rawls Explained: From Fairness to Utopia, Open Court, 2011, 206pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696806.

Reviewed by Tom Bailey, John Cabot University


Paul Voice's Rawls Explained is a fine introduction to John Rawls' political philosophy for students and other non-specialist readers. It presents the major concerns, notions, distinctions and shifts of Rawls' philosophy in an admirably engaging and accessible way and it helps the reader to begin reflecting on the issues with brief accounts of common criticisms and stimulating Rawlsian replies.

Particularly impressive is the account of Rawls' A Theory of Justice which Voice provides in the first part of the book. Voice introduces this with two guiding ideas, that of 'reasonable hope' -- which allows him to emphasize the normative yet realistic nature of Rawls' enterprise -- and that of 'imaginative identification' -- with which he distinguishes Rawls' contractarianism for its abstraction from empirically realizable circumstances and its focus on political and distributive justice, rather than political authority. Voice then provides a wonderfully clear and synthetic account of Rawls' theory. Beginning with the contractual 'original position', he explains the sense of and reasons for the freedom, equality, rationality and reasonableness of the contractors, the framework of fairness expressed by the 'veil of ignorance', the focus on society's 'basic structure' and 'primary goods' and Rawls' more controversial claims about contractors' limited mutual interest and commitment and their concern to 'maximize the minimum'.

Voice then turns to the principles of justice that Rawls derives from the original position. He explains their basic meanings and grounds and Rawls' rejection of utilitarian alternatives, before elaborating on their meanings by discussing specific political issues that arise at each of the further steps which Rawls envisions for their realization. Thus, at the constitutional step, Voice shows how political participation and toleration can be considered in terms of the liberty principle, emphasizing how its priority excludes any other considerations. At the legislative step, he provides an illuminating account of the difference principle and the primary good of self-respect in discussing how the minimum acceptable level of welfare is to be determined. Here he also emphasizes Rawls' reasons for opposing meritocracy, supports Rawls' claim that his just society will tend towards material equality and presents Rawls' reasons for preferring a property-owning democracy over other economic regimes. At the last step, that of the application of laws, he employs Rawls' treatment of civil disobedience to raise the issue of the underdetermined and contextual nature of the interpretation of the principles. Voice ends his account with a helpful broader discussion of Rawls' particular manner of justifying his principles, focusing on the nature of 'reflective equilibrium', the distinction between the 'thin' conception of primary goods and 'thick' conceptions of the good, or the priority of the 'right' over the 'good', and the argument that obedience to the principles of justice is rational since they are integral to our self-understanding as autonomous agents.

Voice concludes this first part of the book with a valuable introduction to the critical debates over A Theory of Justice. Notable here is how, after setting out standard libertarian, feminist and communitarian criticisms, he simply gives a staunch Rawlsian reply to each set, rather than engaging in extensive discussion of them. This encourages the reader to begin reflecting on the issues for him- or herself and will also provide good starting-points for class discussions. Particularly stimulating in this regard are Voice's emphasis on Rawls' subordination of resource distribution to the requirements of democratic citizenship, against libertarian notions of ownership, and his suggestion that Rawls attempts to capture liberal democratic citizens' conception of themselves as agents that are situated and yet free, and thus refuses the dichotomy between 'communitarianism' and 'individualism'.

The following two parts of the book are dedicated to Political Liberalism and The Law of Peoples respectively. Although briefer and not quite as clear and precise in their accounts, as comprehensive and engaging in their discussions or as well-grounded in concrete examples as the treatment of A Theory of Justice, these parts nonetheless provide extremely helpful introductions to the later developments of Rawls' philosophy.

Voice presents Rawls' Political Liberalism as a response to a problem that Rawls came to see with the justification proposed in A Theory of Justice -- namely, that it ultimately rests on a notion of autonomy which will be controversial in a liberal democratic society, given the inevitable diversity of citizens' moral worldviews. In this light, Voice presents the innovations of Rawls' later philosophy as consisting of three main reformulations of the justification of his principles. First, he presents Rawls' notion of 'reasonability' as involving a recognition of the possibility of moral disagreement among rational people and as thus implying an attitude of what Voice calls 'diffidence' towards moral justifications, or 'truths', in politics. Second, Rawls' consequent proposal that political principles be justified not in terms of any particular moral 'truths', but rather by an 'overlapping consensus' among different moral worldviews is presented by Voice as requiring a consensus over the basic values of freedom and equality from which Rawls derived his principles in A Theory of Justice. For Voice, then, this consensus is Rawls' solution to the justificatory problem presented by his earlier work. Finally, regarding the related account of 'public reason', Voice presents Rawls' claim that officials, candidates and voters ought to deliberate in terms of shared political principles, but may employ their diverse moral worldviews if 'in due course' their conclusions can be supported by these principles. Here Voice emphasizes that such 'public' reasoning is open to interpretation and to misuse, giving as helpful examples the controversies that arise over school prayer, gay marriage and abortion.

Readers might be left a little unsatisfied by Voice's treatment of Rawls' overlapping consensus here. For by treating this as a consensus over precisely the values from which Rawls derives his principles in A Theory of Justice, Voice limits Political Liberalism's novelty to an acceptance that citizens may endorse these values for different reasons, based in their different moral worldviews, and may thus begin their 'public' reasonings in these terms. But if the problem which Rawls came to recognize in the justification proposed in A Theory of Justice is that it appeals to a controversial notion of autonomy, then proposing a consensus over related values will seem unlikely to resolve it, since these values will be equally controversial. Voice's claim that this consensus is made possible by the influence of the shared history and traditions of a liberal democratic society on citizens' moral worldviews would thus seem to beg the question. Rather than proposing a consensus over these particular values, then, it may be that Rawls' recognition of the moral pluralism present in liberal democratic societies led him to a more radical reformulation of both the justification and the content of his principles, one which allows that the political values and principles on which citizens may agree will vary according to the particular moral worldviews present in their society and their particular 'overlaps'.

Still, there is some indication of such a reading of Political Liberalism in the Rawlsian replies to common criticisms with which Voice again concludes his discussion. Voice begins by defending Rawls' insistence on 'reasonability' over moral 'truths'. He notes that, on Rawls's account of overlapping consensus, each reasonable citizen may take the shared principles of justice to be morally 'true' for his or her own moral reasons, and need only refrain from employing these reasons to justify his or her political deliberations. He also emphasizes that, although Rawls could not accept any criterion of justified coercion beyond that of reasonable consensus, this consensus is not a merely strategic one since it is based in citizens' moral worldviews. Voice then turns to criticisms regarding the conditions of this consensus -- in particular, its supposed reduction of justice to social stability and its insufficiently pluralist and public character. Notable here is how, while defending Rawls' insistence on shared principles of justice, Voice emphasizes their minimal character and their relativity to the relevant society. This he presents as Rawls' attempt to avoid both a universal, society-independent justification of political principles and the reduction of politics to the strategic management of conflicts among particular interests. One wonders whether Voice might have elaborated on this attempt in his preceding account, and thus introduced readers to a more challenging reading of the philosophical concerns and innovations of Political Liberalism.

The book concludes with an equally succinct introduction to The Law of Peoples. This explains how Rawls there employs his notions of the 'original position' and 'reasonableness' to distinguish liberal, 'decent' and other societies and to derive principles for their international relations, before presenting and engaging with common cosmopolitan and relativist criticisms. Along with his emphasis on the peculiar nature and status of 'decent' societies on Rawls' account, particularly illuminating here is Voice's discussion of Rawls' crucial notion of a 'people'. Voice explains well how this notion allows Rawls to insist on the possibility of principles of international justice against realist skepticism, to draw parallels between the 'reasonableness', learning and moral plurality of citizens and those of societies and to argue for a limited duty of assistance towards foreign citizens, against stronger cosmopolitan claims. In his Rawlsian replies to cosmopolitan criticisms, Voice also defends Rawls' use of this notion by suggesting that peoples may be more effective than global political institutions at achieving justice for individuals, that toleration among peoples should perhaps trump respect for non-'basic' human rights and that the duty of assistance among peoples that Rawls proposes need not be significantly less demanding than cosmopolitan alternatives.

Voice's Rawls Explained thus provides a comprehensive and stimulating introduction to the three major texts of Rawls' political philosophy, achieving particularly exemplary levels of clarity and depth in its treatment of A Theory of Justice. It will be a valuable resource for students and their teachers and also for other non-specialist readers.