Rawls's Political Liberalism

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Thom Brooks and Martha C. Nussbaum (eds.), Rawls's Political Liberalism, Columbia University Press, 2015, 206pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231149716.

Reviewed by David Enoch, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


This is a collection of six new essays -- written by Martha C. Nussbaum, Onora O'Neill, Paul Weithman, Jeremy Waldron, Thom Brooks, and Frank I. Michelman -- engaging with Rawls's Political Liberalism (PL) in different ways: some as an exegetical exercise; some by criticizing it, more or less strongly, or by offering improvements; yet others by attempting to apply some of its insights and arguments to further, related issues and disciplines.

I will briefly summarize each essay, offering some critical remarks as I go along. I will conclude with some general thoughts about the nature of current engagement with Rawls, as exemplified by this collection.

Before doing so, let me make a few points about the technicalities of a collection such as this. I take it that its raison d'ĂȘtre must come from some added value we get in virtue of the different papers sitting there together, in the same volume. This is the case, sometimes, with collections that are introductory in nature, which can serve as a good main text for an undergrad course or a graduate seminar. And this is sometimes the case with volumes of original papers that engage each other. In these respects, this volume is not a success. The contributions vary in ambition and originality -- Nussbaum's is officially an introduction to the main themes of PL, but it contains some original ideas; O'Neill's and Brooks's are not officially surveys, but to a significant extent are composed of surveys, sometimes surveys that could help the uninitiated; and the other texts are straight-up independent papers. And the papers entirely fail to engage each other (the only exceptions I could find were two footnotes where Brooks refers generally to Nussbaum's introduction), this despite there being many cases in which such engagement could advance the debate (such as when Brooks discusses primary goods (163-4) without engaging Nussbaum's interesting comments about them (7), or when Weithman praises (104) Rawls's account of how justice engages our emotions as one of the most interesting parts of the theory, without engaging Nussbaum's discussion thereof). There isn't even a substantive introduction tying together issues from the different contributions (Nussbaum's is an introduction to PL, not to this collection, and the editors' preface is too brief to be substantive) -- and there clearly could have been. For instance, given contemporary literature, it would have been interesting to place the different writers -- and the Rawls reflected in the different papers -- along the real-world/idea-theory spectrum. So, we don't seem to have here an advantage of the collection format (and perhaps there is a relevant old-school advantage of the journal system, namely, its somewhat stricter review process).

None of this, though, is the main thing. The main thing are the papers themselves. Let me turn to them, then.

Being very aware of the difficulties of writing an introduction to an influential book years after its publication, Nussbaum focuses on issues that have not received, in her view, sufficient attention, or that may have been misunderstood. These include the relationship of Rawls to the history of philosophy (because while Rawls routinely lectured on the history of philosophy, he doesn't draw out the relation with other thinkers in his work (10)); the distinction and relations between the criterion of reasonableness as applied to doctrines and to citizens (23-29); the psychological underpinnings of PL (40-45); the application of its main ideas outside of the Western constitutional democracies that are the main case Rawls seems to have in mind (45-51); and perhaps most importantly, an understanding of the development from A Theory of Justice (TJ) to PL according to which there are no conflicting claims in the two books, which rather address different questions. The main question for PL is that of stability (for the right reasons) (e.g. 5-9).

I found many of these contributions, despite their limited scope here, quite interesting. For instance, the quick discussion of historical influences (10-16) is insightful and suggests ideas I had not been familiar with (like the major influence on Rawls of Hobbes, and the relation of this influence to the centrality of stability), but then again this may also be due to my ignorance of the history of philosophy. And the discussion of the assumptions Rawls seems to make (and anyway, to need) in moral psychology, and in particular about the emotions, is very helpful (and ties nicely into some of Nussbaum's original work). The chapter is also scattered with very interesting asides (like the claim that, perhaps appearances to the contrary notwithstanding, PL is more committed to egalitarian redistribution than TJ (18-9), the somewhat gentle claim that "There are many difficulties with Rawls's account of European and U.S. history" (48), and the follow-up on the discussion with Susan Moller Okin of the relation of all of this to feminism (31)).

Still, at times I found Nussbaum's discussion frustrating -- a point I return to below -- because while she is very clear and honest about flaws she finds in PL, she does not seem to be willing to follow through to the implications of these flaws. We are thus in somewhat critical, but still very much friendly -- much too friendly -- territory.

O'Neill's "Changing Constructions" is primarily a discussion of the relations between TJ and PL. According to O'Neill, the main difference between the two books is not the emphasis in PL on something like the principle of legitimacy (PL 137) that requires justifying political principles to those bound by them -- this, O'Neill insists, is present already in TJ (59). The main innovation is that the ultimate justificatory procedure has shifted. In TJ, it's the procedure of selection in the original position, or rather -- an important, often neglected point -- it's the reflective-equilibrium-type justification procedure, of which the original position is but a component. In PL, however, the justificatory procedure is the public-reason-justification, under conditions of overlapping consensus, that ultimately justifies political principles and arrangements (60). While O'Neill draws out some implications of this difference between TJ and PL (as to "who counts" in the relevant construction procedure), she neglects some other important implications -- presumably, the PL procedure is not quite as hypothetical as the TJ one. It involves real people, adhering to real doctrines, attempting to reach a (perhaps somewhat idealized) consensus. It's not the kind of procedure one can go through alone, in one's study (as the TJ procedure presumably is). Surely, this is a difference of some significance, perhaps of fundamental significance -- both for understanding Rawls's views, and for understanding constructivism. But O'Neill doesn't discuss this difference here.

In "Legitimacy and the Project of Political Liberalism" Weithman offers an almost entirely historical, exegetical discussion. He characterizes "the standard reading" of the shift from TJ to PL (73-4), according to which Rawls came to realize that his account of stability in TJ rested on unrealistic assumptions about convergence in the well ordered society, and as a result came to focus his attention on stability rather than on justice. Weithman rejects this reading. Though legitimacy plays a crucial role in PL, it's not as if it was irrelevant in TJ; and anyway, it's not as if PL is about legitimacy in the same sense that TJ is about justice. The real role of legitimacy in PL is different (91-2): The fact that the reasonable will appreciate the importance of legitimacy is what guarantees that even when they are conflicted, even when the public-reason political procedure will push them in directions that are in tension with their comprehensive doctrines, still they will be most strongly motivated to follow public reason -- this, because legitimacy (as understood in PL) is also a mode of justification.

I am not competent to engage Weithman on matters of exegesis. But I find the main innovation unconvincing on substantive grounds. Weithman's account still relies, quite problematically, on Rawls's claim that the public-reason motivations of the reasonable at least typically outweigh all others; and what's more, it's crucial for Weithman's solution that legitimacy is a "form of political justification" (101). Now, "legitimacy" is a badly ambiguous term, of course, and in some senses is undoubtedly a form of justification. But it is entirely unclear that the kind of legitimacy Weithman discusses -- the kind purportedly governed by the principle of legitimacy, about justifiability to all -- also has justificatory force, and in particular justificatory force that is not exhausted by all the other considerations already taken into account at this stage. So it's not clear that progress has been made.

Waldron, in "Isolating Public Reasons", is about as far as can be from exegetical work in a book dedicated to another book. He is interested in one version (probably not very Rawlsian, and anyway, not Rawls's) of the idea of public reason. Waldron explains in detail the appeal of the distinction between public and private reasons, and of the famous Rawlsian duty of civility not to rely in the political sphere on private reasons. He thinks of these ideas as a tentatively optimistic response to otherwise bleak (but, importantly, not necessarily oppressive) prospects -- where all that really has effect in politics is power and numbers, rather than reasoned, shared deliberation (114-5). Still, these ideas cannot withstand criticism. First, while it's plausible that achieving overlapping consensus is a part of the job of the political philosopher, it's implausible that this is all that it's her job to do. She also has to worry about objective truth, regardless of acceptability (124). Second, and more importantly, reasons are inter-related in subtle ways, so that the public reasons one endorses, once no longer a part of the complex that also involves private reasons, are not the same as they were in that wider, richer, not-entirely-public context. Third, people help themselves to thoughts about unintelligibility much too easily. Often, atheists can make sense of claims of the religious, and vice versa, and so on. Of course, often they do not -- they don't put the effort needed into understanding each other, perhaps even justifiably. But surely this doesn't make others relying on intelligible but non-understood reasons non-civil (134).

I find Waldron's criticism both important and convincing (then again, I wasn't a fan of public reason going in). Indeed, the point about the interconnectedness of reasons may be strengthened: If, for instance, normative judgments are the upshot of a complex of reasons interacting in all sorts of holistic ways -- enabling and disabling; excluding, weakening and strengthening; outweighing and undermining; etc. -- then Waldron's point against the distinction among reasons between private and public becomes even stronger. Perhaps some things can be said in reply, but Waldron does an excellent job of raising this issue as a topic about which public reason theorists haven't given sufficient thought. On the way, he also makes the extremely important observation that some of the reasons we are asked not to bring into the public sphere are moral reasons, having to do with the dignity and wellbeing of others. His example is that of Justice John McLean, who -- in the Dred Scott case -- relied on comprehensive, religious reasons. And while we may be concerned about whether we wrong McLean when we disallow those reasons in the public sphere, surely the more important thing to remember -- Waldron insists plausibly -- is that we're wronging Mr. Scott. This, at any rate, is how things look from McLean's perspective -- so by asking him to exclude those moral reasons, we're asking him to wrong Scott in this way. It's not easy to see how this can be justified.

There is, however, also a central problem in Waldron's discussion -- at least if you were hoping to get a criticism of Rawls and Rawlsians. The problem is that throughout, he understands the accessibility requirement -- the way in which reasons must be accessible to all if they are to be public reasons -- in terms of intelligibility. This is why insisting that there's less unintelligibility than meets the eye is important. But Rawlsians don't agree that this is the relevant criterion for accessibility, and some of Waldron's criticisms just don't apply to the accessibility conditions they do endorse. More importantly, it's not clear whether they apply to the version of the accessibility requirement that best responds to the underlying concerns motivating it.

Brooks, in "The Capabilities Approach and Political Liberalism", makes two main points. The first is a response to some criticisms of Rawls: once the problem of stability has been fully recognized, the objection runs, the solution -- in terms of an overlapping consensus -- will not work. His response is that while the overlapping consensus is indeed intended to play a major role in the response to the stability problem, it's not as if it's supposed to do the work all by itself. There are more resources Rawls can -- and does -- help himself to, and perhaps the most important among them is the social minimum, that can help achieve stability. Conjoined with these other resources, Rawls's appeal to an overlapping consensus succeeds. The second main point is a suggestion for an improvement -- Brooks sides with Amartya Sen (162) suggesting that Rawls would have been better off endorsing the capability approach, rejecting Rawls's reasons for not doing so. The two points connect -- the social minimum can help in securing stability especially well if it's understood along the lines of the capability approach.

Brooks's discussion is, as we just saw, critical of Rawls at points. But Brooks accepts the general framework, and tries to make progress by improving on the details and responding to objections. This is legitimate, of course, but one is tempted to go more external. Why is it, after all, that stability is so important, perhaps more important, perhaps even lexically so, than anything else? Brooks doesn't discuss this question. More troubling is the fact that Brooks is not clear on what he means by "stability". Rawlsians typically emphasize (in this volume too) the importance of stability for the right reasons, and at times Brooks too pays tribute to this phrase. But most of the time he seems to be talking simply of stability, engaging in entirely instrumental discussions of how best to achieve it. It's just that with stability thus understood, first, it's not clear that Brooks's is a defense of Rawls; second, it becomes even more implausible to think that stability is more important than any other political desiderata; and third, the discussion is methodologically problematic: after all, if we're really interested in finding out what the effects on stability are of social bonds (150) and of reasoned public deliberation (152) we should presumably do empirical sociology, not reflect on this from the armchair.

Michelman, in "The Priority of Liberty: Rawls and 'Tiers of Scrutiny'", thinks about what political philosophy can learn from the law (178). He utilizes a feature of US constitutional law -- the two-tier system of constitutional protection of liberties -- in order to shed light on otherwise puzzling claims of Rawls about the ways in which liberties are, and the ways in which they are not, prior to the general pursuit of background justice; and he tries to see how a Rawlsian judge would implement a Rawlsian constitution according to the underlying Rawlsian political philosophy. The picture he ends up with is (suspiciously) harmonious -- American constitutional law and Rawlsian political philosophy go remarkably well together. Michelman's reading of Rawls that emerges is as follows: While there is a list of basic liberties, "liberty of conscience" is also an umbrella term for many other liberties, so the list is not closed. But there are two different levels of protection, one for the items on the list and another for the rest: only other considerations of liberty may defeat the former, but the latter may be defeated by considerations of background justice as well. This allows Michelman (to allow Rawls) to defend the results that seem right on a number of initially troubling cases: a mandatory health insurance should not (in general) be unconstitutional because it does not violate the liberty of conscience (or any liberty on the basic liberty list); a blanket prohibition on physician assisted suicide should be unconstitutional, as it does violate liberty of conscience; and the state can criminalize female genital mutilation even if doing so will offend against some parents' liberty of conscience because it doesn't get priority over, say, considerations of bodily integrity, a background condition needed, among other things, for developing and pursuing one's conception of the good.

While I share Michelman's hope that political philosophy can learn something from the law, I don't think this is often the case, and am unconvinced this is so here. Of course, thinking about the law may be helpful to making progress in political philosophy -- it would be surprising if it weren't. But this -- as in Michelman's discussion -- is a matter of the context of discovery, where pretty much anything can be helpful. Whether the law can play a role in the context of justification in political philosophy remains an open question. One reason to suspect that it does not is that while it makes sense for Michelman to give policy considerations in favor of the constitutional two-tier system, it's not clear this works for reading Rawls: Michelman says (199) that we can't classify everything protected under the umbrella liberty of conscience as a basic Liberty because we don't want to give it the kind of priority this would entail. But if this is how things go, then basic liberties are basic because we have reason to give their protection the relevant kind of priority. My impression was that for Rawls and Rawlsians, the basicness of some liberties is supposed to do some explanatory and justificatory work, so that the "because" goes in the opposite direction: These rights and liberties merit special priority because they are basic liberties.

Despite having its critical moments, the book beams with admiration for PL. But this is both odd and unhelpful. It is odd because in almost all of the contributions, one can find things said about Rawls and PL that, if included in a referee report for a contemporary journal, would be very naturally read as a justification for a rejection verdict. Consider: Nussbaum's discussion of serious unclarities, even thirty years after, regarding the reasonable -- a central concept in the theory -- as well as her insistence that we need to know much more about how Rawls understands "controversial", and in particular how he would distinguish between science and metaphysics (28); O'Neill's claim that "It seems as if Rawls assumed more than is advisable if fundamental political arrangements are to be justified but also less than is needed for justifying political arrangements in a globalizing world." (63); Weithman's claim that "the notion of legitimacy is frustratingly undertheorized." (105), as well as the attribution of a major misreading to many central writers in the field -- surely not a compliment to the misunderstood writer; and many of Waldron's critical points (some of which already mentioned above).

And the admiration is also counterproductive. At this point, PL has been with us for a while. So have many criticisms thereof, some, in my mind, quite devastating. If people still find Rawls inspiring and worth discussing this is all right, of course. But they should do so in a way that's sensitive to the many relevant flaws. If you're going to be doing Rawlsian stuff at all, you had better make progress rather than use the same problematic slogans again. So when Nussbaum seems okay with describing what Rawls relies on at crucial points as a hope and a practical postulate (4; see also Brooks, 142) without explaining how a hope is even relevant here, where we seem to want a factual judgment; when Brooks rejects Rawls's claim that the capabilities approach would be rejected by some of the reasonable (163-4) without noting the difficulties in understanding the "reasonable" and even more in attempting to use this concept to reach specific conclusions; or when Michelman just takes the entire Rawlsian framework on board without questioning it--when this is the kind of discussion we get of Rawls, it is hard to see how it helps.