Re-Emergence: Locating Conscious Properties in a Material World

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Gerald Vision, Re-Emergence: Locating Conscious Properties in a Material World, MIT Press, 2011, 264pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015844.

Reviewed by Philip Goff, University of Liverpool, and Hedda Hassel, University of Oslo


In its broadest sense, emergentism about the mental is the view that the mental arises from the physical. As such, it's arguably compatible with physicalism, if it's thought that mental properties are simply a special kind of physical property, or that their emergence can be accounted for in wholly physical terms. In this book Gerald Vision defends a much more radical version of emergentism, according to which mental properties are not physical; instead, mental properties are realised by distinct, physical bases, and this happens as a matter of brute, inexplicable fact. Although Vision argues that physicalism fails, he doesn't adopt this kind of emergentism as a last resort. Rather, he tries to show us that emergentism is a theoretically attractive metaphysical view in its own right, and that departing from physicalism is not problematic in the ways that philosophers tend to assume. Critics often say that emergence is a mysterious relation that can't be clearly specified, and that emergent properties can't be assigned a proper causal role without violating causal closure or generating troublesome overdetermination. This book argues that both problems can be solved and so, contrary to common philosophical opinion, there is no reason to avoid emergentism.

Re-Emergence is an original work that contains a number of creative and interesting arguments. However, in the end we are not persuaded that it succeeds in making a compelling case for emergentism. This is partly because central ideas are not made sufficiently clear and comprehensible, and partly because not enough is done to justify the view that the relation between the mental and the physical should be considered metaphysically unintelligible or brute.

Emergence and brute realisation

Let's begin with the first common challenge for emergentists, namely to say exactly how the term 'emergence' should be understood. Vision construes emergence as a kind of realisation. The notion of realisation is often employed by non-reductive physicalists, as it is thought to allow for token-identity of the mental and the physical. But in Chapter 3 Vision argues that realising bases need not be identical with the properties they realise, and so realisation can also serve as a model for emergence. The argument is mainly based on consideration of cases like a statue and the lump of clay that composes it. According to the argument, even though the statue depends on the lump of clay for its existence, the statue and lump are still not identical as they have different persistence conditions. For example, the lump of clay cannot survive the removal of a chunk of material, while the statue can survive the loss of an arm. Vision uses this to show that one thing can depend -- with metaphysical necessity -- on another spatially overlapping thing, without them being identical.

But how is the realisation of the statue by the non-identical lump of clay supposed to compare to the realisation of mental properties by physical properties? This is not entirely straightforward, as Vision goes on to divide realisation into subspecies: physicalistically acceptable composition on the one hand, and non-physicalistic emission on the other. Mental properties are not composed, but emitted, Vision claims. The reason for making the distinction is that if mental properties were merely composed by physical parts, phenomenal consciousness would be 'no more than a giant neurological complex' (p. 142), and this would leave out the distinctive features of consciousness. But what emission really amounts to turns out to be rather elusive. By what Vision admits to be 'very partial' analogies, it is compared to the way a chemical gives off an odour (p. 47), and to the relation between a factory robot and the product on a production line (p. 142). However, emission is not causal (p. 47), we are explicitly told, it is a rather different kind of constitutional dependence between different or distinct existences.

We find it difficult to interpret Vision's position on this important point. On the one hand, one might think that emission is just like causation, except for being synchronic, or otherwise not conforming to all features of some standard analysis of causation. So maybe the view is that there are brute psychophysical laws just as there are apparently brute physical laws, as seems closer to standard emergentist views.

But on the other hand: can realisation be understood as a matter of brute correlation? When a lump of clay realises a statue, or material parts realise a computational function, and so on, this seems perfectly intelligible and not at all like something that must be taken with 'natural piety' (as the leading emergentist Samuel Alexander once recommended for emergent phenomena). When we take realisation, but remove all intelligibility by declaring it brute, it's not clear that what we are left with can still usefully be called 'realisation'. Thus we worry how much progress this constitutes in the direction of demystifying non-physicalistic emergence.

In a sense, since realisation is usually taken to imply intelligibility, classifying emergence as realisation serves to distract from the bruteness claim, so we should emphasise that the view is that emergence is metaphysically brute. This means not just that we will never understand how or why the mental arises from the physical. If the relationship is metaphysically brute, there is nothing there to understand -- the physical gives rise to the mental for absolutely no reason. Many might find it unsettling that mentality should in this way, as it were, defy all possible rationality. In a metaphor, there is nothing about mental emergence that makes sense even to God. Vision explicitly rejects epistemic interpretations of the bruteness claim, and thus he must not be interpreted as, e.g., a mysterian along the lines of Colin McGinn (who holds that unknown, undiscoverable properties in matter subserve consciousness). In the final paragraph of the book, Vision remarks that there is a view that demands emergence to be in principle intelligible, and as such may lead us to think that 'some explanations lie outside human competence' (p. 230), but this he regards as 'more a mindset than a thesis' (p. 229). However, we can't see any clear reason why it shouldn't be philosophically worthwhile for non-reductionists about the mental to proceed in this or other more speculative directions, e.g., panpsychism, rather than embracing brute emergence. At the very least, brute and inexplicable necessary connections seem to constitute a significant theoretical cost.

Mental causation

We move on to the problem of mental causation, a big headache for emergentist views, and for many the main reason for preferring physicalist identity theory. There is arguably a strong inductive case to be made that the physical world is causally closed: every physical event has a sufficient physical cause. If the event of my screaming and running away has a sufficient physical cause, say c-fibres firing, and the event of my screaming and running away also has a mental cause, say my feeling pain, and these two events are neither identical nor part of a single causal chain leading to my screaming and running away, it seems to follow that the event of my screaming and running away is overdetermined. There doesn't seem to be enough room for both mental and physical properties to govern behaviour without this resulting in systematic overdetermination, i.e., many events having too many causes.

In response to this concern, Vision claims that realised events are not in causal competition with their realisers. He asks us to consider the following example:

A pillar topples from high above the street and lands on a car. Both the pillar and its slab of marble toppling over might be cited as the sufficient cause of the dent in the car's hood. Assume that, as argued here, they are not identical. Does one cause preclude the other? (p. 89).

It seems plausible that they don't. And so, analogously, if my pain is realised by my c-fibres firing, the fact that both cause my screaming does not result in my screaming being over-determined, or at least it does not result in 'overdeterminations of a threatening kind' (p. 103).

Furthermore, it is argued that we can't get away from the conclusion that higher-level, realised things are genuinely causal by insisting that all causation is reducible to causation on the fundamental level, i.e., fundamental physics. As Vision points out, interaction in fundamental physics looks very different from the macro-level causation with which we are familiar, such that some philosophers have denied that there is such a thing as causation in fundamental physics at all. Additionally, Vision claims that it is also conceivable that there is no fundamental level; it could turn out that we live in a world that descends into an infinite regress of lower and lower levels. Still, Vision argues, it seems the reality of everyday higher-level causation is compatible with both of these possibilities. Hence higher-level causation should not be thought to depend on lower-level causation.

These are interesting and relevant considerations. It's instructive to see how the problem of mental causation may be broken up into worries about 'too many causes' on the one hand, and on the other hand the (unjustified according to Vision) intuition that only fundamental-level causation is proper and real. But there may be a problem with Vision basing his solution to the problem of mental causation entirely on an analogy with physical higher-level causation. Vision explicitly confirms that this is how it's supposed to work:

it would seem that our discussion of the relationship between causal powers of realizers and the realized is best conducted across a wide spectrum of cases rather than being focused on instances of emergent properties. However, any results we achieve will be directly transferable. (p. 62)

As we have noted already, however, it's not easy to see how mental properties realised by emission compare to physical properties realised by composition. The difference between composition and emission is significant enough to incur doubts about whether results about realised physical properties are indeed 'transferable' to mental properties. A more explicit defense of this reasoning by analogy would have been very helpful.

An additional worry is that Vision's solutions may require a broadly Humean regularity theory of causation, where causation is ultimately grounded in regularities and similarity relations across possible worlds. As has been discussed in the literature, overdetermination does not seem as threatening on a Humean view, because on the Humean view the discernment of higher-level causes is not a matter of positing new features of reality, i.e., irreducible powers, we are rather just identifying new regularities or counterfactual dependency relations that supervene on what the world already contains. Vision explicitly recommends that we adopt causal contextualism, which falls under the umbrella of Humeanism, as a way of illustrating how mental and physical events might be understood not to compete with each other. As he explains: 'a host of complementary explanations of a single explanandum are possible because objective reality can be carved up in numerous ways' (p. 99).

However, on a non-Humean view where causation is irreducible, perhaps a matter of things having basic causal powers in virtue of which they bring effects about, things look a bit different. If it is an irreducible fact about the world that my c-fibres firing brings about my screaming and an irreducible fact that my pain brings about my screaming, then we do seem to be back to a worrying kind of overdetermination. On the non-Humean view, overdetermination is arguably more serious because it involves the multiplication of concrete things such as causal powers, not merely making new distinctions.

Of course, Humeanism is accepted by many, and insofar as it can solve the problem of mental causation, that might in itself constitute an argument for it. However, some readers -- perhaps many of those who are also reluctant to embrace brute emergence -- will worry that Humeanism comes with its own theoretical difficulties. For a Humean the fundamental regularities in nature are metaphysically brute, which many philosophers worry makes it something of a 'cosmic coincidence' that the world continues to behave in such a regular and predictable manner. Some even worry that Humeanism undermines the rationality of induction. At any rate, if the physicalist, by identifying mental and physical properties, can account for mental causation whilst remaining neutral on the Humean/non-Humean debate, then this seems to be an advantage of physicalism over emergentism.

Arguments against physicalism

The second half of Re-Emergence is devoted to arguments against various types of physicalism, from type-identity theory, to functionalism, representationalism and token-identity theory. Many of the arguments given here are variations on familiar themes; for instance, the well known multiple realisability objection is the main objection given to type-identity theory. It is worth noting, however, that Vision builds his case against physicalism entirely without relying on conceivability arguments, such as the zombie argument. If zombies are possible, then so much the better for (nomological versions of) emergentism, Vision claims, but he doesn't want his case to be reliant on controversial premises about what we are capable of conceiving.

Chapter 8 offers an intriguing argument against a certain kind of mental/physical identity. Vision suggests that, in certain cases, the very intelligibility of identifying a mental property, say (again) pain, and a physical property, say c-fibres firing, is dependent on being able to locate each property in space and time prior to identifying them. This is unproblematic in the case of the physical property. But it is not possible, thinks Vision, to identify the spatial location of pain except by identifying it with some physical property. It's not that we can know a priori that pain lacks a spatial location. It's just that we can't characterise it as having a spatial location prior to identifying it with c-fibres firing, and this is required according to Vision in order to render intelligible that very identity. Although we are unsure about whether it can be decisive, it is clearly an argument that warrants consideration.

Overall, how attractive one finds Visions' defence of emergentism perhaps depends on one's background commitments and philosophical persuasions. If the problem of mental causation is your main reason not to accept emergentism, and you are open to a Humean view about causation, this book offers original and interesting considerations, although they do require some unpacking on the part of the reader. But if your main worry about emergentism is the relation of emergence itself, or brute connections in general, then we you will not find many answers here, as realisation by emission remains mysterious, and the acceptability of ultimate metaphysical bruteness is more or less taken for granted.