Re-Presenting the Good Society

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Maeve Cooke, Re-Presenting the Good Society, MIT Press, 2006, 264pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 026203347x.

Reviewed by Barbara Fultner, Denison University


In this "postmetaphysical" era of philosophy, real differences between relativists and non-relativists are often elusive.  Sophisticated non-relativists recognize the impossibility of a "view from nowhere," and sophisticated relativists acknowledge normative phenomena.  Maeve Cooke does a great service to critical social theory by carefully mapping this discursive terrain.  Simultaneously, she weaves the positions with which she engages into a social-theoretical tapestry to develop her own view of the Good Society, one at once permanently open to contestation and permitting context-transcending validity claims.  The book presents a much needed analysis of the frequently misunderstood and abused notion of a regulative ideal.  The first four chapters bring opposing positions into dialogue; the second four develop Cooke's positive account.  Her approach is broadly Habermasian.  However, she historicizes communicative rationality, reins in Habermas's cognitivism by emphasizing the affective pull of regulative ideals, and curbs his formalism by attributing substantive content to them.  

Critical social theory requires diagnoses of contemporary society informed by emancipatory conceptions of the Good Society.  Radical contextualists like Richard Rorty and context-transcending social theorists like Jürgen Habermas share a commitment to what Cooke terms situated rationality.  That is, epistemologically, we have no unmediated access to reality; our views are always historically, culturally, and socially conditioned.  Ethically, critical social theory should be "guided by the deep-seated, normative intuitions and expectations of the inhabitants of the social order in question" (17) rather than by the purported normative insights of an authoritarian social critic. Radical contextualists seek to satisfy the emancipatory claims of critical theory by appealing to "normative ideas implicit but not fully realized within a given sociocultural context" (14).  They deny that fundamental normative claims in one sociocultural context are any more rational than those in another and reject progress toward truth and justice as illusory.  Radically contingent, their critical perspective cannot be extended beyond their particular context.  Cooke rejects radical contextualism on familiar grounds.  Rorty, to her, presents a false dichotomy: either contingency and linguistic mediation, or bird's-eye-view; either reasons are assessed from some neutral standpoint, or rational argument is tantamount to strategic persuasion (32). 

By contrast, context-transcendentalists appeal "to normative ideas that are at once immanent to the sociocultural context in question and transcend it" (15).  They view a culture's normative commitments as subject to rational assessment and allow for cross-cultural evaluation.  In doing so, however, they open themselves up to charges of authoritarianism.  Reconciling context-transcendence with situated rationality is the justificatory dilemma facing critical theory, according to Cooke.  The tension underlying this dilemma must be "negotiated rather than eliminated" (4).  The dialectic of the book exemplifies this thesis:  She criticizes Rorty's reading of Habermas, next confronts Habermas with the same problem as Rorty, and so on.  Although this occasionally seems to leave Cooke criticizing her interlocutors for trying to strike the very same balance she herself aims to find, it serves to spell out the exact requirements of a situated, but context-transcendent rationality.

The source of context-transcending validity in the theory of communicative action, according to Cooke, is the ideal speech situation (ISS).  What happens in empirical practices can be criticized against the idealizations projected by the ISS.  Cooke objects, however, as she did in Language and Reason, that Habermas cannot ground the requisite idealizations in universal features of language.  Rather, "certain of these idealizations orient communicative practices only in certain sociocultural contexts, as a result of certain historical developments" (51).  She regards moral validity (mandating against excluding anyone based on race, gender, social class, ideology, intellectual capacity, etc.) as dependent on a specifically modern notion of moral argumentation.  This historicization pushes Habermas towards radical contextualism.  Second, Cooke worries that formal pragmatics cannot ground Habermas's normative claims regarding a balance between communicatively rationalized lifeworld and functionalist rationality.  Third, she asks how a historicized discourse ethics might explain why agents obey moral norms embodied in communicative rationality (57).  (Cooke links the problem of justification with that of motivation via autonomous agency:  Roughly, once it is established that rational agents assess normative claims autonomously, it follows that when the critical diagnoses and emancipatory ideals of a social theory can be justified, they motivate agents to adopt and act in accordance with them; see chapter 6 for a model of autonomy and practical rationality.)

Since the third point follows from the historicization of communicative rationality, I briefly address only the first two:  1) While the conception of autonomous agency may be distinctly modern, I'm less persuaded that the presuppositions of communicative action (that speakers raise validity claims about what is true and right, that a valid consensus involve all concerned, etc.) are.  To say that a given claim was de facto considered valid because it was decreed by a moral authority, is not to say that the rational potential for moral deliberation is lacking in the language in question.  De facto acceptance is distinct from in principle validity.  Moreover, the intersubjective ideals of equality and mutuality of perspectives are built into linguistic communication between interlocutors taking yes/no stances on each other's claims.  To make her case, Cooke would have to replace the theory of communicative action with an alternative account of communication or give up on the idea that a general theory of communication is possible.  She claims "the link between validity and argumentation [to be] historically contingent" (129).  Yet surely the Ancients or Medievals raise claims to validity and support them with arguments, much as we do.  2)  Formal pragmatics per se need not address the balance between system and lifeworld; rather, this balance can be assessed by examining the extent to which agents are overburdened (in terms of communicative rationality) and/or suffer from communicative pathologies.  

To flesh out a historicized concept of context transcendence, Cooke turns to poststructuralism.  She rightly sees critics like Judith Butler and Ernesto Laclau as needing to "develop accounts of context-transcending validity that permit cross-cultural and transhistorical interrogation" (75).  They reject not universality per se, but its static conceptions "that refuse to acknowledge their own dependency on particular cultural values, fail to respond to their own constitutive exclusions, and block attempts to rearticulate them in more inclusive and emancipatory ways" (78).  Cooke appreciates Butler's critique of excessive cognitivism, her defense of "the somatic dimension of practices of criticism," and her conception of a concrete and radically open universality, but ultimately deems her unable to account for context transcendence. 

Laclau's appeal to the Lacanian Real as a transcendent ethical object she finds more promising.  Universality, for him, is an "'empty place' … filled by a succession of particular (failed) representations of universality" (96).  Although universality is always mediated by representation, it -- along with truth, justice, etc. -- remains inaccessible and inexpressible for us; the universal becomes a "necessary impossible object."   This inaccessibility is essential for context transcendence.  Representations of the transcendent object (or re-presentations -- the significance of the hyphen is never explained) are "imaginary constructions" (Georges Sorel): fictions, but not purely because of their imagery.  They are characteristic regulative ideals: necessarily inadequate to what they represent, they are contentful and exert an affective pull.   Cooke elaborates Laclau's concept of ideological closure, distinguishing between harmless "metaphysical" closure and pernicious "ideological" closure.  The former refers to treating concepts necessarily as closed (fully articulated, complete, etc.) even though such closure is impossible.  The latter removes the contents of such concepts from critical view.  Since he does not make this distinction, Laclau posits the transcendent object as empty to avoid ideological closure.  For Cooke, metaphysical closure of ethical ideals does not entail ideological closure.  She denies that the transcendent ethical object is empty since otherwise it could not guide action.  Representations of the good society are metaphysically closed -- but neither empty nor ideological.

Cooke reads the ISS as a re-presentation of the good society.  As regulative ideal, it has material reality and rationally motivating power.  It is an affectively imbued, imaginative projection of a form of social cohesion and order: a perfect state of communication.  It is a fiction, but not a pernicious one (114-5).  It is not obvious a) what this implies about the content of the transcendent object, the good society; and b) whether positing a transcendent object as a quasi-second-order regulative ideal is necessary at all.  Cooke approaches the question of how to conceive the gap between the transcendent object and its representations by examining Habermas's account of truth.  She criticizes Habermas for initially defining truth and justice as rational consensus under ideal justificatory conditions.  The ill-named "consensus theory of truth," I have argued elsewhere, is best understood as a theory of justification in which truth functions as a regulative ideal.[1]  Habermas even then acknowledged that consensus, paradoxically, can be criterial for truth only if it is in principle defeasible.  Cooke underestimates this fallibilist side of Habermas.   She describes the gap between transcendent object and particular representations in the early Habermas in terms of truth/justice versus actual consensus; accordingly, the ISS gives content to the transcendent object because truth and justice are defined in terms of ideal consensus (104-5).  However, this seems to confuse a re-presentation of the transcendent object (ISS re-presenting the good society, ideal warranted assertibility re-presenting truth) with its empirical instantiation (actual consensus). 

Cooke endorses Habermas' revised account of truth, according to which truth exceeds justification even in ideal conditions,[2] and proposes extending this revision to justice and morality.  Moral validity should be postulated as a transcendent object, preserving an ineliminable gap between it and its particular articulations analogous to the gap between truth and its articulations.  The transcendent object in the case of truth is "recalcitrant reality" (the objective world to which we have no unmediated access and which cannot be exhaustively described).   What analogue to this justification-transcendent point of reference is there in the moral domain?   Habermas' point is that there is no moral realm independent of us, but that "the projection of a moral world and the presupposition of an objective world are functionally equivalent."[3]  Cooke's worry seems to be in part that unless we postulate an ethical transcendent object over and above the regulative ideal of discourse ethics, we are left with a static conception of society where all contestation comes to an end.  Yet the ideal of universal consensus seems no more and no less static than the ideal of a correct description of reality.  Even on a constructivist understanding of moral validity (ideal consensus of all concerned about the universalizability of norms), particular articulations of moral validity will always already be open to challenge and revision.  Nor need a society exemplifying the ISS be static.  Its members would interact with one another and with their environment so that new situations would continue to arise and need to be debated under ISS conditions.   Although Cooke voices a preference for Laclau's ideal society as permanent contestation over Habermas's ideal of consensus, she also grants that democratic struggles are motivated by a desire for harmony and reconciliation (186) without thereby committing herself to a static conception of the good society.  The advantage of postulating a transcendent ethical object over and above regulative ideals as Cooke seems inclined to do thus remains open to doubt.

For Cooke, the ISS as regulative ideal raises a validity claim.  As "stand-ins" for the transcendent object, which can never be fully represented or known, representations of the good society "claim to disclose the transcendent object more powerfully, and to articulate it in ways that provide better ethical orientation, than other, rival representations… " (120).  They must be subject to rational assessment because if "autonomous agents are to be able to accept such claims, they must be able to have reasons for doing so" (120).  The disclosive and possibly also the orienting claim go beyond Habermas' classification of validity claims (truth, normative rightness, sincerity).  Alas, Cooke does not address the relationship between his tripartite typology and these claims.  I would also have liked to see her elaborate how disclosure accounts for context-transcendence (simply by disclosing the transcendent object) and orientation for rational assessability.   How can validity claims inherent in regulative ideals be simultaneously disclosive and discursive?[4]  Cooke acknowledges that discourse is not a primary mode of disclosure (122-3).  She contrasts a painting or music that powerfully discloses the transcendent object in a way that cannot be captured discursively with an ethical orientation accepted for conventional reasons.  Since the work of art could not be shared or assessed discursively (both debatable inferences), its ethical orientation could not be intersubjectively criticized.  Does the requirement of discursivity flow from the disclosive and orienting functions alone?  If a given representation of the good society, perhaps a work of art, makes a claim on me to powerfully represent the transcendent object and to provide a better ethical orientation, why does that have to be articulable linguistically?  Perhaps the requirement derives from the fact that we are concerned with representations of the good society in the context of critical social theory, which are therefore always already discursive.   Cooke claims that the pictorial or imagistic character of such representations is crucial, tying it to their motivating power -- both affective ("arousing feelings of attraction") and rational.  The pictorial aspect of representations of the good society is "important from the point of view of justification [because] if particular ideas of the good society did not take the form of more or less determinate pictures of a social order whose claims to validity can be formulated as propositions, norms, or principles, they would not be open to argumentative forms of critical interrogation" (125).  That may be true, but does not explain how pictures (used as non-discursive examples of representations of the transcendent object) can be translated into propositional validity claims.  Cooke's cautions against overestimating the power of argumentation do not help to address this.  She asserts that representations of the good society have semantic content that can be articulated in the form of validity claims in virtue of their material and pictorial aspects, but does not support this claim (190).  Hence we are left with two questions:  What exactly is a non-discursive validity claim?  And what is the connection between pictorial imagery and semantic content?

This extremely rich and rewarding book challenges us to rethink fundamental concepts in critical social theory.  One may not always agree with Cooke's interpretations or accept her arguments, but one learns from engaging with her.


[1] B. Fultner, "The Redemption of Truth: Idealization, Acceptability and Fallibilism in Habermas' Theory of Meaning," International Journal of Philosophical Studies, vol. 4 (2), 1996, 233-251.

[2] J. Habermas, Truth and Justification (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 2003).

[3] Habermas, op. cit., 266.

[4] See C. Lafont, The Linguistic Turn in Hermeneutic Philosophy (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1999).