Re-Thinking the Cogito: Naturalism, Rationalism and the Venture of Thought

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Norris, Re-Thinking the Cogito: Naturalism, Rationalism and the Venture of Thought, Continuum, 2010, 273pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441171542.

Reviewed by Mario De Caro, Università Roma Tre


Christopher Norris's Re-Thinking the Cogito is composed of an introduction and six chapters. The long introduction gives the general background of the book. In chapter 1, "Living with Naturalism, Full-Strength: Why Philosophers Find It Hard," the stage is set for both the most important critical target of this work -- that is, the "quasi-naturalist" views that according to Norris dominate contemporary philosophy, especially in the analytic world -- and for the positive project -- a defense of a radically naturalized philosophical perspective, inspired by neuroscience and cognitive psychology, that according to the author is also able to account for what is worth wanting in rationalism. In chapter 2, "Frankfurt on Second-order Desires and the Concept of a Person," Norris critically evaluates a prototypical attempt to articulate the quasi-naturalist view, i.e., Harry Frankfurt's well-known account of personhood by means of the notion of higher-order volitions. According to Norris, Frankfurt's view is irremediably unstable, and both the naturalists and the anti-naturalists can legitimately criticize it from their respective points of view. Chapter 3, "Deflating the Cogito: Thought, Knowledge, and the Limits of Consciousness," deals with the so-called "hard-problem" of consciousness. Norris harshly criticizes mainstream philosophy of mind for still being in the wake of Cartesianism as long as it does not clearly distinguish between thought and consciousness. The alternative he advocates is a deflationary stance towards consciousness, which completely renounces the idea of its conceptual and methodological primacy.

In chapter 4, "Catching Up with Spinoza: Naturalism, Rationalism and Cognitive Science," Spinoza -- one of the three heroes of this book -- is praised for having worked out a non-reductive but inflexible monism with regard to the mind/body problem and the free will problem. In doing so, Norris notices that Jonathan Israel's and Antonio Damasio's interpretations of Spinoza would have gained important support had they considered the seminal work of continental scholars such as Deleuze or Balibar. The views of the second hero of the book are discussed in chapter 5, "Alan Badiou: Mathematics, Politics, and the Venture of Thought." Badiou's views -- with his affirmation of the primacy of ontology over epistemology and truth over knowledge, and his interpretation of mathematics as prima philosophia -- are praised as a precious source of inspiration for the new naturalism that Norris shoots at. Finally, in chapter 6, "Deconstruction Naturalized: Beyond the 'Linguistic Turn,'" the views on the Freudian unconscious by the third and possibly most important hero of the book, Jacques Derrida, are discussed. Norris's highly unorthodox final claim is that, at least in his discussion of Freud, the founder of deconstructionism defended a consistent and very promising form of naturalism, for which "the naturalizers should be keen to welcome him on board" (237).

This book announces nothing less than "another 'Copernican revolution', one that goes beyond and directly against the exclusive focus on human epistemic capacities and limits that Kant connoted by his use of that phrase" (13). In this light, Norris aims at articulating a strong form of naturalism that, while inspired by neuroscience and cognitive psychology, will not "exclude the normative dimension -- the appeal to certain likewise irreducible standards of right reason, logic, consistency, consilience, argumentative warrant, and so forth" (19). The goal of this book, then, is to reconcile scientific naturalism with normativity by means of "a radically naturalized perspective that Spinoza was the first to envisage and which has nowadays arrived at the threshold of maturity with the advent of a neuro-philosophical approach to issues in epistemology and philosophy of mind" (71).

This is not the kind of book that aspires to make everyone happy. In the first page, for example, one can read the following statements:

philosophy of mind in the mainstream-analytic, i.e., the dominant Anglo-American line of descent has very largely run out of steam or arrived at the point of having pretty much exhausted its always rather exiguous stock of proprietary concepts and categories. . . . This state of exhaustion is everywhere apparent in the relentless narrowing of focus, the cult of technical (or pseudo-technical) expertise in fields where this is simply not called for, the obsessive dwelling on a handful of well-worn topics for debate, and the onward march of an academic culture given over to the almost exclusive pursuit of a 'research' agenda set entirely by its own self-absorbed interests and priorities. . . . [T]his is a 'degenerating research-programme', in Imre Lakatos's sense of the term. (1)

But analytic philosophy is not only attacked for the alleged exhaustion of its philosophy of mind: here and there, harsh treatments are also reserved for analytic epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, philosophy of language, metaphysics and metaphilosophy. Consequently, with very few exceptions (such as Timothy Williamson and Paul Churchland), the most authoritative figures of the analytic movement (from Quine, Davidson, Putnam and Kripke to Searle, Dennett, McDowell and Brandom) are severely criticized for having marked only superficial discontinuities with the dualistic traditions of Descartes and Kant. And the same treatment is given to many influential continental philosophers such as Gadamer, Foucault, Lyotard and Habermas. Indeed, it is contemporary philosophy as such that according to Norris has, with very few exceptions, gone astray.

Once it is assumed that the state of contemporary philosophy is so uniformly disappointing both in the analytic and in the continental worlds, one may strongly suspect that a common infective germ exists. For Norris this is the "protean beast" known as "linguistic turn" (205), which transmitted the lethal legacy of the dualistic and anti-naturalistic tradition to the vast majority of the contemporary philosophical world. In fact, Norris claims, both the analytic and the continental world have been deeply affected by the harmful idea that "language is in some sense the ultimate horizon of intelligibility" (40). One of the most apparent late consequences of this original sin (which is exemplified in different fashions by Rorty, Dummett, and the postmodernists) is "a marked convergence" of the two traditions towards several retrograde forms of anti-realism.

Another consequence is the contemporary proliferation of proposals that aim at reconciling the spirit of the linguistic turn, which is intrinsically anti-reductionist, with some forms of naturalism in metaphysics, ethics and epistemology. For Norris, this idea of a non-reductionist naturalism is hopeless, notwithstanding the efforts of many influential analytic philosophers (including Davidson, Putnam, Strawson and McDowell) who, under the mesmerizing spell of the linguistic turn, have tried to reconcile the manifest and the scientific images by appealing to "compromise notions such as 'supervenience', 'emergent properties', or 'anomalous monism'" (12). Summarizing, for Norris the linguistic turn, in all its varieties, has generated a powerful but very unhealthy antinaturalistic Stimmung, in which the world of nature is opposed to the world of thought, the space of causality is opposed to the space of rationality, nomological concepts are opposed to normative concepts. As a result, most contemporary philosophy is in a dead end.

The positive part of the book is less trenchant but not less provocative. Norris tries to sketch an innovative and radical naturalistic view that in his opinion will provide "the only adequate means by which rationalism can actually get a hold on the world" (19). The first step in this direction is the acknowledgment that neuroscience and cognitive psychology have proved the falsity of two connected claims of the modern tradition: that consciousness "must be the precondition for any exercise of thought at its fullest creative or inventive stretch" and that "it is the restraining effect of unconscious, subliminal or unexamined beliefs that puts up the greatest resistance to change across the whole gamut of human intellectual endeavour" (2). It is time, then, to abandon the last vestiges of dualism and move toward the right kind of naturalism -- that is, a view that "far from undermining the main tenets of a rationalist outlook," would in fact provide "the only adequate means by which rationalism can actually get a hold on the world" (19).

Certainly, a new naturalistic philosophy seriously respectful both of the scientific achievements about the mind/brain and of the main tenets of rationalism is the dream of the vast majority of contemporary philosophers. But how could one realize such a philosophical dream? The most provocative claim of this intentionally provocative book is that a very promising model for that kind of view is Derrida's early discussion of the Freudian unconscious. Now, there is not much doubt that Derrida would not have described himself as a naturalist philosopher -- and very few, if any, among Derrida's scholars would be happy with this interpretation. Moreover, the vast majority of contemporary naturalist philosophers would shudder at the idea of marching in lockstep with the creator of deconstructionism. Norris of course is aware of that (226), but he is unmoved.

First of all, he thinks that it is time for "chipping away the old analytic/continental distinction" (199): if Derrida had good ideas, why should not the analytically trained philosophers listen to him? Second, in Norris's opinion we should carefully distinguish Derrida's deconstructionism from the postmodernism of "gurus such as Lyotard and Baudrillard" (203). The latter is one of the most virulent forms of antirealism and came directly out of the continental side of the linguistic turn; the former is a realist philosophical project, uncontaminated by the linguistic turn. Moreover (but this is something that Norris does not say), it is well known that philology and respect for the author's intentions were not primary concerns for the same Derrida when he deconstructed other philosophers' texts. So why should one worry too much if one interprets him differently from how he would have liked?

In his reading, Norris points to a specific aspect of Derrida's philosophical development, exemplified most clearly in the essay "Freud and the Scene of Writing" (which discusses Freud'sProject for a Scientific Psychology). In this regard Norris quotes with enthusiasm Richard Harland, according to whom, through Freud, Derrida came to see ordinary-sense consciousness as "an illusion that human beings have invented because they have feared the consequences of a materialist conception of the brain" (237). As Norris remarks, Derrida was happy with Freud's full-fledged naturalism, which encompassed the "materialist conception of the mental as wholly and exclusively a product of neuro-physical processes and events" (228) and had "distinctly proto-connectionist motifs" (228). However, the key point is that Derrida's deconstruction of Freud's text focuses attention

on that intrinsically elusive aspect of language that serves not merely as an analogue to the Freudian unconscious but rather as the very locus of those operations -- chief among them metaphor (or substitution) and metonymy (or displacement) -- that psychoanalysis reveals as the structural correlates of unconscious thought (229).

Norris remarks that Derrida insists on the impossibility of having a language without neuro-physical correlates. Moreover, for Derrida "writing offers our best means of descriptive or explanatory access to the unconscious and its workings" (229). The analogy here is between the two couples of concepts "speech/writing" and "conscious/unconscious" -- where the latter members of the couples are the material ones. And this, according to Norris, shows that Derrida's deconstructionism is not an anti-realist practice, as it is commonly viewed, since it is monistically anchored in the properties of the physical world and therefore is very "far from leaving us stranded in a realm of free-floating textual signifiers" (225). Therefore, according to Norris, Derrida's reading of Freud is not only compatible with a full-fledged naturalism, but also powerfully reveals "the problems . . . that have marked the consciousness-first doctrine from its Cartesian inception down" (237).

As I have said, many of the claims raised in this book are highly controversial -- and this is, predictably, the main reason for its interest but also its weakness. It is surprising for example when Norris claims that in contemporary Anglo-Saxon philosophy there are not many full-fledged naturalists. Certainly, there are influential thinkers who have tried to develop feasible forms of non-reductionist or liberal naturalism of the kind that Norris deeply dislikes. But the present fortune of many philosophical views informed by cognitive science, of new fields such as neuroethics and neuroaesthetics, of ambitious eliminativist or reductionist programs in many branches of philosophy (which of course tend not to share the spirit of the linguistic turn) shows clearly that full-fledged naturalism is a very strong current of contemporary Anglo-Saxon philosophy. Also, Norris discusses a large number of contemporary philosophers, generally with a very critical tone, but sometimes the criticisms are so condensed that they are not easy to understand, not to say evaluate (see, for example, the brief critical assessment of Dennett's multiple-drafts theory of consciousness at pp. 235-236).

Further, one may wonder how Badiou's peculiar mathematicism could be reconciled with Derrida's deconstructivism (however realistically this is interpreted): Derrida is not mentioned in the chapter dedicated to Badiou and, vice versa, Badiou's name does not appear in the final chapter, where Derrida is the crucial figure and the positive moral of the book is drawn (moreover, Derrida is not mentioned in the introduction either, and this is something that does not help the reader). However, in the end the reader has the impression that the burden of sketching the kind of naturalism that Norris envisages is mostly on Derrida's shoulders. However, is Derrida the appropriate source of inspiration for such a task -- even if one prudently confines oneself to Derrida's reading of Freud?

Let's leave aside the fact that Norris is controversially interpreting Derrida who is controversially interpreting Freud. Another puzzling feature of this long book is that it ends rather abruptly, and the reader is left with the impression that an important part is missing -- the part in which the Derridean naturalism that Norris endorses should be seriously tested on the issues that are discussed in the first four-fifths of the book. More specifically, if in the last chapter something (not entirely perspicuous) is said about the "hard problem" of consciousness, this does not happen with the free-will problem, the question of what personhood is, or the mind-body problem -- even if these problems are discussed at length in the previous chapters. So one wonders how Derrida's proposal should contribute to solve, or to dissolve, these problems. To take another example, from the point of view of Derridean naturalism, what should one think of the relation between the normative concepts (which, as Norris seems to acknowledge, are essential for conceiving us as rational beings) and the naturalist concepts? Norris does not like the "compromise notions" of contemporary philosophy of mind and metaphysics, but what Derridean notions should one use instead for assessing these fundamental problems?

Finally, in reading Derrida who reads Freud, Norris takes for granted something that is very contentious. This is the idea that Freud's unconscious is analogous or comparable to the cognitive or computational unconscious of contemporary psychology so that, in discussing the former, one would ipso facto say something relevant in regard to the latter. However, it has been convincingly argued that the Freudian unconscious, differently from the cognitive one, is conceived as an extension of the categories of commonsense psychology (this is why Donald Davidson, by the way, was happy with psychoanalysis), and most of mental life is still conceived as conscious. For this reason, in the Freudian model it is still true that our choices are mostly taken at the conscious level, even if the unconscious may sometimes play a role. However, this is a view that nowadays, according to the same Norris, neuroscience and cognitive psychology have falsified.[1] Therefore, even if one wanted to grant that the main problem of contemporary philosophy is accounting for what present-day cognitive science and neuroscience say about the mind and the brain, it would be doubtful that looking back to Freud would be of much help.

[1] See N. Manson "A tumbling-ground for whimsies? The history and contemporary role of the conscious/unconscious contrast," in T. Crane and S. Patterson (eds.), The History of the Mind-Body Problem (London: Routledge 2000), and M. Marraffa, "Remnants of psychoanalysis. Rethinking the psychodynamic approach to self-deception," Humana Mente, forthcoming.