Reading Bernard Williams

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Daniel Callcut (ed.), Reading Bernard Williams, Routledge, 2009, xi+292pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415771900.

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, University of Aberdeen



This set of essays on the philosophy of Bernard Williams, who left a rich and until recently largely unexplored philosophical oeuvre after his death in 2005, is chiefly addressed to moral psychology and political philosophy. Several chapters take up such familiar topics as internal and external reasons (Joshua Gert), the emotions (Peter Goldie), and literature and character (Frances Ferguson). Others bring new issues to the fore. Charles Guignon illuminates Williams’s debt to the phenomenological tradition, and John Cottingham charges Williams with a too ready acceptance of the view that one’s moral aspirations and ethical judgments are determined and limited by one’s situation and culture and too little respect for the transcendental aspects of ethics. Sharon Krause believes that Williams “has given us valuable resources for correcting the present absence of political agency in political theory today” by rejecting the Kantian presumption of autonomy and rendering the notion of agency individual and personal; other contributors are not so sure. On the whole, the treatment of Williams is sympathetic to his originality, his acuity, and his gadfly characteristics but critical of his stance on particular points. As Daniel Callcut points out in his Introduction, Williams’s work has generated many research programmes, but he has few imitators and few disciples.

Simon Blackburn’s essay leads off the volume with an account of the dispute between Williams and Hilary Putnam over the notion of an “absolute conception” of reality. Williams distinguished between “the world as it is independently of our experience”, and “the world as it seems to us”. This distinction was fundamental to his claim that there cannot be a science of morals along with the natural sciences of physics, biology, and so on. Blackburn defends Williams against the efforts of Putnam to argue that relational properties including colors and the “thick” concepts of ethics can be objective properties of the world. This seems right; going further, one might say that Williams made it clear that objectivity in moral judgments requires not only a defensible notion of normal perception but, what is even more problematic, a defensible notion of normal preferences. Carol Rovane discusses a related point: relativism. Williams hinted that there might exist “normatively isolated” judgmental communities, each in possession of bodies of opinion that could not be compared against one another to assess their logical consistency, a doctrine which, when the opinions are deemed “true”, she calls “multimundialism”. Rovane defends the logical coherence of the notion but leaves open the task of examining Williams’s own potential examples of normative isolation (Aztecs, Samurai) to see whether “multimundialism” is actually realized in our world.

Writings by and about Williams can be complicated, diffuse, or both. The most enjoyable essays in the volume are those that are both passionate and focused, like Williams at his best. In “The Architecture of Integrity”, Daniel Markovits analyzes the “Jim in the Jungle” dilemma in detail. Invited to do so by a gunman and far from all sources of aid, should Jim kill one captive to save twenty? Williams challenged the utilitarian who maintains that Jim is obliged to save 20 out of 21 lives when he can do so, suggesting (Williams usually did not “argue”) that it is the privilege of moral agents to refuse such invitations even if the refusal to act makes matters worse from the utilitarian standpoint. Analyzing the case from third-person, second-person, and first-person standpoints, Markovits argues that, while some cases of moral privileging are self-indulgent, the sacrifice of utility for the sake of personal integrity — the desire for clean hands — has a psychological grounding in a kind of energy-sparing moral inertia. Adopting such commitments minimizes the costs to agents of calculation and deliberation, which can be so exhausting as to reduce moral motivation. Exploring further the theme of ethical passivity and helplessness that runs through Williams’s writing, Martha Nussbaum goes head to head with Williams on his interpretation of Greek tragedy in a magisterial essay on “Tragedies, Hope, and Justice”. Williams’s view of tragedy, she observes, “lies very close to that of Schopenhauer” who believed that the attitude instilled by tragedy is that of resignation to the hopelessness of the world. Williams, she charges, minimizes the role of “blameworthy human action” in producing suffering; “his reaction to ‘reality’ lacked anger”, she writes. Adopting the persona of the philologist, the literary critic, and the moral philosopher, Nussbaum corrects Williams’s readings of the tragedies of Ajax, Philoctetes, and Antigone; indicates what a kind of sleeves-rolled-up engagement with real life horrors can accomplish; and shows how fiction can figure as a force for social change.

Another fine essay by Christopher Kutz is devoted to Moral Luck and to Williams’s discussion of “Gauguin”, the agent who shakes off conventional relationships and responsibilities to pursue what Williams was in the habit of referring to as a “project”. Williams’s view was that personal projects gave color and dimension to their world and energized agents in a way that neither the world-bettering goals of the utilitarian nor the duties of the Kantian could do. Such projects might either fail, as Anna Karenina’s romance-project did, ruining the agent’s life or exposing him to condemnation — or succeed, bringing satisfaction and glory despite his indifference to social duties and obligations. Kutz’s paper is agreeably clear and conclusive. He observes that Williams had contradictory things to say about the justification of “Gauguin’s” actions and that the only morals that can validly be extracted from William’s discussion are that ex ante assessments of rightness are apt to be absent or to differ from ex post assessments, that injured parties will judge differently than offending agents, and that both will judge differently from historically remote future assessors. He reminds the reader of the dangers of commitments and projects that give life its meaning but that have not been assessed by ordinary moral standards. It is one thing to be a martially disaffected spare-time painter hoping to join the ranks of the great; it is another to be a general with imperial ambitions or a group of co-conspirators with a bomb project.

This collection is a useful complement to that published in 2007 by Alan Thomas. The present editor, Daniel Callcut, is the author of a PhD thesis and a number of articles on Williams, and he has studied his subject in depth. His short introduction, in which he argues that Williams is best seen as a philosopher tempted, but not seduced, by moral skepticism is a worthwhile mini-essay in its own right.