Reading Brandom: On Making It Explicit

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Bernhard Weiss and Jeremy Wanderer (eds.), Reading Brandom: On Making It Explicit, Routledge, 2010, 371pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780415380379.

Reviewed by James R. O'Shea, University College Dublin


Anyone interested in Robert Brandom's influential magnum opus in the philosophy of language, Making It Explicit: Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment (Harvard, 1994), will want to own this fine collection of new critical essays on Brandom's work by prominent philosophers along with clarifying replies by Brandom. By now most philosophers are aware, at least in general terms, of why Brandom's work is as controversial as it is important. Making It Explicit (hereafter 'MIE') is arguably the first fully systematic and technically rigorous attempt to explain the meaning of linguistic items in terms of their socially norm-governed use ('meaning as use', to cite the Wittgensteinian slogan), thereby also giving a non-representationalist account of the intentionality of thought and the rationality of action as well. Brandom attempts to accomplish these goals by providing a fully worked out inferentialist as opposed to classical representationalist or truth-conditional semantics for natural languages, and then providing on that inferentialist basis an explanation of the expressive and explicitating role of logic and of traditional semantic vocabulary such as 'true', 'refers' and 'represents'. So, beginning with practical normative attitudes and corresponding statuses of commitment and entitlement to claims -- norms that are implicit in our practices of giving and asking for reasons -- Brandom's thick book attempts to chart a "Social Route from Reasoning to Representing" (chapter eight of MIE).

Bernhard Weiss and Jeremy Wanderer have assembled an outstanding group of philosophers to probe and criticize or amend and extend Brandom's project. Part I on "Normative Pragmatics" includes chapters by Allan Gibbard (reprinted from 1996), Charles Taylor, Daniel Dennett, Sebastian Rödl, John MacFarlane, Wanderer, Mark Lance and Rebecca Kukla (co-authors), John McDowell, and Rowland Stout. Part II, "The Challenge of Inferentialism", reprints an important exchange from 2007 between Brandom and his sharp critics Jerry Fodor and Ernie Lepore (co-authors). Part III on "Inferentialist Semantics" features Danielle Macbeth, Michael Dummett, Michael Kremer, Weiss, Kevin Scharp, and Bob Hale and Crispin Wright (co-authors). Brandom's responses in Part IV then occupy a substantial sixty-eight pages. This organization nicely recapitulates the logical development of MIE, from issues concerning Brandom's normative pragmatics, through the inferentialist and expressivist semantics, to the culminating issues pertaining to representation and objectivity. In their helpful introduction to the volume (pp. 1-11), Weiss and Wanderer appropriately highlight four central themes from Brandom's MIE: 1. linguistic rationalism, 2. the sociality of norms, 3. inferentialism and representationalism, and 4. language entries and exits (i.e., perceptual observations and intentional actions). Here the editors do not shirk the hard work of providing useful overview commentaries relating substantial themes from each of the chapters to one or more of those four topics. Overall I think it would be hard to improve upon the organization and execution of the book, which fulfils its aims admirably.

The editors characterize Brandom's 'linguistic rationalism' as consisting in his explicit prioritization of the linguistic act of propositional assertion over all other linguistic acts, as the "downtown" of language:

The linguistic rationalist affirms both that it is possible for there to be a linguistic practice involving practitioners capable only of asserting, and that any social practice involving practitioners lacking the ability to assert is not a linguistic practice (p. 3).

Strictly speaking, on Brandom's view the characterization of 'linguistic rationalism' ought to include the distinctively rationalist idea that, as he put the thesis in his subsequent shorter version of MIE's project, Articulating Reasons (Harvard, 2000, p. 189),

a performance deserves to count as having the significance of an assertion only in the context of a set of social practices with the structure of (in Sellars's phrase) a game of giving and asking for reasons… .This inferentialist idea might be called 'linguistic rationalism'.

However, the editors are rightly concerned to stress that several of the critics in the volume specifically object to the particular way in which Brandom privileges the act of assertion over all other pragmatic aspects of discursive practice, as opposed to objecting to the inferentialist semantics per se (though some of the critics do that as well). Such critics argue that there are additional necessary conditions of linguistic practice that cannot intelligibly be regarded as optional or be abstracted from in the way that Brandom's assertion-based account, they contend, attempts to do. This is a general style of criticism that runs throughout many of the chapters and in relation to all four of the topic areas highlighted by the editors above. In his replies to this and other criticisms in the volume, Brandom frequently charges that his critics have misunderstood various subtle methodological aspects of his approach in MIE, and this is the angle I will focus my discussion on here.

Gibbard, in 'Thought, Norms, and Discursive Practice', finds Brandom's expressivist account of normativity and meaning to be promising in general, but he does not find convincing arguments for the view that the norms of meaning and thought are essentially social rather than being conceivably private or grounded in an individual's thoughts. In his reply Brandom takes the opportunity to provide a helpful sketch for the reader of the Kantian grounds of his views on normativity in general and the normativity of intentional content in particular. (Brandom's summary of his views in this case reflects the rich historical discussions to be found in his recent book, Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas, Harvard 2009.) When it comes to the question, "is normativity in general and as such social?", Brandom's reply includes the methodological remark that his own "suggestions on this general point … are meant in an open-minded, irenic, experimental spirit" (p. 298). He grants, for example, that while he holds that normativity and hence meaning must be cashed out in social terms, in a way that reflects and builds upon his interpretation of well-known arguments of the later Wittgenstein, one might alternatively attempt to go with Dennett or Ruth Millikan and seek to naturalize normativity via considerations pertaining to optimality of design or proper biological function. For Brandom himself, however, the key source of the normativity that makes possible conceptual content is the 'I-Thou' interpretive difference in social perspective between, in the terms of his 'deontic scorekeeping' semantics, "acknowledging a commitment (oneself) and attributing a commitment (to someone else)" (p. 298). Gibbard usefully presses a variety of questions concerning animal cognition (orangutans) as well as the possibility of 'Crusoe'-type cognition across perspectives constituted by different time-slices of a single inner mental life. Here again Brandom clarifies the precise status of his claim concerning the sociality of normativity and content, doing so in a way that will perhaps strike some Wittgensteinian readers as surprising: "if creatures can take up the different perspective to time-slices of themselves," he grants, "then the relation among those time-slices is social in the sense that it must admit of the distinction of perspectives between the attitude of attributing a commitment (or other normative status) and the attitude of acknowledging it" (p. 299).

The article by Lance and Kukla, 'Perception, Language, and the First Person', is among other things a helpful gateway into the perspective of their new book, 'Yo!' and 'Lo!': The Pragmatic Topography of the Space of Reasons (Harvard, 2009), which they acknowledge to be strongly influenced by Brandom's normative pragmatic semantics in general. They argue, however, that with respect to perception and action Brandom's account severs "the agent-relative, voiced dimensions of linguistic practice," in particular the richly first-person experiential yet concept-laden "recognitives" ("Lo, a rabbit!") and "vocatives" ('Yo, Emma!'), which they argue are "constitutive of any language with the expressive capacity to make meaningful empirical assertions" (p. 127). By contrast they contend that "Brandom makes the remarkable claim that it is merely a contingent matter that discourse is bounded by perception and action, and that in principle it could exist without them (MIE, p. 234)" (p. 115). If one follows up the page they cite from MIE, one can see grounds for this attribution to Brandom. Brandom accounts for our non-inferential 'language entries' (i.e., empirical observations) and 'language exits' (intentional actions) in MIE chapter four, i.e., only after having given an account of the propositional contentfulness of inferentially articulated assertion in general in the previous chapters. (As Brandom notes in his reply, however, chapter four falls within Part One rather than Part Two of MIE.) On the cited page Brandom writes:

The three structures of authority that the model of assertion … comprises are mutually irreducible, but not all are equally fundamental. The inferential authority invoked by justification and the testimonial authority invoked by deference are intelligible apart from the default authority of noninferential reports; but inferential and deferential practice are two sides of one coin, apart from which the authority of noninferential reports is not intelligible. (MIE, p. 234)

Brandom does hold, then, that the basic normative-pragmatic inferentialist account "of assertional commitments and their contents can be understood in advance of the enrichment" by the accounts of perceptual observation and rational action (ibid.). However, he also says further down the same page:

The empirical and practical involvements of claims … make a fundamental contribution to their contents. Only a model that incorporates both of these not purely inferential dimensions of discursive articulation has any prospect of generating propositional contents that resemble those expressed by the declarative sentences of natural languages (ibid.).

So are Lance and Kukla correct to attribute to Brandom the view that "discourse" in principle "could exist without" such empirical and practical involvements? In his reply to Lance and Kukla, Brandom again begins by highlighting the general methodological character of the project in MIE:

When I am vandalizing Neurath's boat, and so trying to specify the absolutely minimal conditions on a practice deploying propositional contents (being a practice in which something can be said, so thought), the one and only speech act that must be present is asserting. According this sort of unique, defining significance to asserting is a bold and antecedently implausible conjecture. I think it is often useful to adopt a Popperian philosophical methodology: developing and defending the strongest, most easily falsifiable not-yet-falsified hypothesis. We learn a lot from seeing for what reasons, and to what extent, such a hypothesis needs to be qualified and amended. But even then, it is important that the bit where one takes it back be preceded by a bit where one actually says it. (p. 316)

In this respect Brandom thinks that Lance and Kukla are doing the right thing by asking, with respect to his "assertionalism", just "what such an approach must overlook or leave out" (ibid.). In the present case, however, Brandom argues that his assertional scorekeeping model already does accommodate the points raised by Lance and Kukla. For instance, the first-personal nature of "recognitives", he contends, is accommodated by his view of perceptual judgments as acknowledgments of commitments by perceivers themselves; only as such acknowledgings would such responses be endorsed as reliable by scorekeepers (pp. 318-9). Brandom's further clarifications on this issue again bring out an underlying methodological distinction:

Of course perception and agency are necessary features of any autonomous discursive practice… . My remarks in passing (intended in a 'for all I know' spirit) about the possible intelligibility-in-principle of conceptual content isolated or insulated from inferential connections to language entries and language exits is a gesture toward the possibility of a non-autonomous region of discourse, for instance some pure mathematics, in which such contents might live. (p. 318)

So the 'independently intelligible', 'minimal conditions' on discursive propositional contentfulness noted above apparently do not entail 'autonomy' of discourse in the relevant sense. Although Brandom's reply to Lance and Kukla occupies only four pages, additional clarifying distinctions of this kind are made along the way. For example, although Brandom grants that for any autonomous language "it is always possible to introduce explicit locutions and speech acts" corresponding to the authors' "recognitive" and "vocative" speech acts, he claims that such normative statuses could in principle be practically distinguished in scorekeeping practices without the scorekeeper having the expressive resources to say this (pp. 318-9).

Similarly delicate and clarifying methodological distinctions are involved in many of Brandom's other replies to the contributors. It will of course be up to the reader to judge in each case whether with such distinctions Brandom is in some cases presenting a moving target to his critics or whether, to the contrary, he is correctly highlighting distinctions that have been overlooked by his critics. There is no doubt, however, that Brandom's clear and brief replies will be exceptionally helpful to readers engaging with Making It Explicit. Brief mention of a few more examples will have to suffice here.

In 'Brandom on Observation' McDowell argues that Brandom's attribution of a 'two-ply' account of observation to Wilfrid Sellars is both wrong about Sellars and deeply implausible in itself. According to McDowell such an account entirely eliminates the fundamental role of sensory experience in perception, whether the latter is understood as Sellars does or as McDowell does. Reliable chicken-sexers, McDowell argues, have everything that Brandom attributes to our 'perceptual observations', yet unlike ordinary perception the chicken-sexers are not able to appeal to their own experiences as what justifies their reports. Brandom grants that in his account of observation "perceptual experiences, if any, are only contingently involved" (p. 323). After a complex discussion of McDowell and Sellars that merits more attention than I can give it here (my own view is that the truth lies somewhere in between McDowell and Brandom on the interpretive issue concerning Sellars), Brandom closes by again emphasizing that his stripped down view of observation has been offered "in the spirit of vandalizing Neurath's boat," in this case by asking: "Could the responsiveness to reality of some discursive practitioners -- no doubt, ones quite different from us -- be 'chicken-sexing all the way down'? I do not see why not. McDowell, as I understand him, thinks the answer must be 'No'" (p. 325). The details of McDowell's article and Brandom's reply are terrain that would be well worth exploring further than I can here.

Kremer's compelling article, 'Representation or Inference: Must We Choose? Should We?', like McDowell's piece, also raises objections to Brandom's account of our perceptual contact with or sensory intuition of objects in the world. Kremer does this in a particularly elegant way by arguing that "Brandom's anti-representationalist arguments are salutary insofar as they remind us that representation without inference is blind; but taken as arguments for inferentialism, they lead us astray, causing us to forget the equally important insight that inference without representation is empty" (p. 244). Brandom's reply here again points to several pertinent methodological distinctions (pp. 348, 349, 352), but in the end, as in his reply to Lance and Kukla, he argues that his stripped down inferentialist account does have the resources, contra Kremer, to account for a sufficiently robust notion of representing particular encountered objects. Kremer's argument that inferentialism and representationalism should be conceived as mutually interdependent dimensions of meaning and cognition might usefully be compared with MacFarlane's equally careful analysis in 'Pragmatism and Inferentialism'. MacFarlane argues that Brandom's pragmatism about the relation between semantics and pragmatics is consistent with both inferentialism and representationalism (particularly with Davidson's pragmatist version of truth-conditional semantics), contrary to what Brandom seems to suggest is the case with his tight connection between normative pragmatics and inferentialist semantics. In reply Brandom argues that a pragmatist in his sense need not be an inferentialist: there is not a definitional connection between the two, but rather "one can say in a pragmatic vocabulary what it is one needs to do in order thereby to make semantic concepts applicable to one's performances" (p. 314). This is one of several places in his replies where Brandom indicates how the distinctions developed in his more recent book, Between Saying and Doing (Oxford, 2008), can help to clarify the structure of the project in MIE.

Brandom's response to Fodor and Lepore's vigorous objections to his inferentialist semantics ('Brandom Beleaguered') again features, inter alia, a methodological point: namely, that his brand of inferentialism, according to which all the inferences that essentially involve a given expression are treated as bearing on that expression's 'meaning', is self-consciously "a radical policy, which requires giving up many things we have become accustomed to say about conceptual content"; in fact, "in a certain sense" it "involves in the end giving up the idea of conceptual content" (p. 333). Accordingly, he grants that less radical inferentialist approaches are possible, including Sellars' own approach to meaning and conceptual content. As Brandom says in this connection in his reply to Macbeth's rich discussion in 'Inference, Meaning, and Truth in Brandom, Sellars, and Frege', "the principal issue for me is not the extent to which the MIE account [of inferentialism] is antecedently plausible, but how workable and powerful it is" (p. 340). Brandom's reply to Fodor and Lepore also includes a useful brief synopsis of his 'incompatibility semantics' account of compositionality in Between Saying and Doing (chapter five and appendix). Central to Brandom's reply in general is a distinction between formal semantics and philosophical semantics, one of several distinctions that are also mobilized in Brandom's friendly "conjecture" as to how Dummett ('Should Semantics be Deflated?') "does not see that we have no quarrel here" -- including in particular a distinction "between explanatory and expressive deflationism" (p. 344). Brandom argues that he is not 'deflating semantics' in the sense that Dummett is concerned to reject.

Space prohibits a discussion of all of the articles in this collection, but all, in the opinion of this reviewer, are of high philosophical calibre, including the contributions by each of the editors themselves: Weiss's 'What is Logic?' and Wanderer's 'Brandom's Challenges'. There will no doubt be wide interest in the substantial contributions in the collection made by famous philosophers who have not been discussed above: for example, Taylor on 'Language Not Mysterious?', Dennett on 'The Explanation of "Why?"', and Hale and Wright on 'Assertibilist Truth and Objective Content: Still Inexplicit?' Stout's contribution, 'Being Subject to the Rule To Do What the Rules Tell you To Do', offers an interesting criticism of Brandom's account of intentional action, within a shared Kantian framework, while simultaneously displaying some of the virtues of Stout's own analysis of rational action as developed in several recent books. Rödl's 'Normativity of Mind versus Philosophy as Explanation: Brandom's Theory of Mind' argues forcefully that MIE's

methodology requires that the normative concepts its account deploys be logically independent of intentional concepts. Its rejection of the Myth of the Given requires that they be irreducible to non-normative concepts. These conditions cannot be satisfied simultaneously (p. 66).

Brandom counters in reply that explicitating accounts, in his sense, are not reductive explanations (p. 311). Scharp's 'Truth and Expressive Completeness' argues that "Brandom's commitment to producing an expressively complete theory of meaning is incompatible with his choice of a broadly Kripkean approach to the liar paradox" (p. 273), a point which Brandom partially accepts while contending that it does not disable the role that truth plays within the project of MIE.

The contributions by the philosophers in this volume whose graduate work was originally in Pittsburgh over the last three decades -- Kremer, Macbeth, MacFarlane, Scharp, Lance and Kukla -- range insightfully across topics from Kant and Frege to Davidson and Kripke, spanning the full range from the history of philosophy to the latest disputes in philosophical logic, philosophy of language, and epistemology, and with no holds barred in their constructive criticisms of Brandom's work. One of the side-effects of the volume is thus to display the merits and the diverse products of that particular philosophical proving ground. The quality of the engagement by all of the philosophers in this collection indicates that Brandom's Making It Explicit is achieving its wider goal of stimulating vigorous critical reflection upon the possibility of a normative pragmatic and systematic inferentialist conception of our rational nature.