Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology

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Sean Gaston and Ian Maclachlan (eds.), Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology, Continuum, 2011, 230pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441152756.

Reviewed by Zeynep Direk, Galatasaray University


De la grammatologie is one of three books which Jacques Derrida published in 1967, the other two are La voix et le phénomène, and L'écriture et la différence. De la grammatologie (Paris: Les Éditions de Minuit) was translated in English as Of Grammatology by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak and first published in 1976 by Johns Hopkins University Press. A corrected edition of the translation appeared in 1997. Since its translation in English a number of commentators have tried to explain and discuss the philosophical issues the book presents.

Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology gives us a good perspective from which to think through what has been so far said about Derrida's book. The book is a careful selection of valuable exegeses on parts of Of Grammatology by Derek Atridge, Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak, Geoffrey Bennington, J. Hillis Miller, Forbes Morlock, Sean Gaston, Ann Smock, Michael Syrotinski, Christopher Johnson, Julian Wolfreys, Peggy Kamuf, Paul Davies, Clare Connors, Nicholas Royle, Michael Naas, Jean-Luc Nancy, Sarah Wood, Timothy Clark, and Ian Maclachlan. It is interesting to see how different commentators reading the same pages could focus on different moments of the text, following their own thread, seeing the totality of the work presented by Derrida from different aspects. Nevertheless, as one continues to read through Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology one gets the impression that most of these commentators could agree with each other.

A newcomer to the field would be surprised by the ubiquitous affirmation and the absence of critical tension in Derrida studies. The constitution of Derrida studies as a place of fundamental agreement between friends, rather than that of dissent and antagonism, can be seen as a consequence of the historical fact that the domain itself was under constant attack from the outside. The dangerous effect of this communal tranquility that outlaws frontal attacks can be the production of texts that do not do anything other than the doubling of text with a commentary. As all readers of Derrida would know, "the task of reading" is not merely to reproduce the original text, but also to point to the oddities in authors' writings that lead them beyond their conscious, voluntary, and intentional relationship with the history to which they belong. Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology forces us to ask whether most Derrida scholars have done more than doubling the various positions of Derrida's text, and whether the time has come for them to move on from their first task of making his corpus acceptable in academia by making it more accessible and more easily digestible.

Of Grammatology is one of the texts to which people turn in order to make sense of "post-structuralism." It was Derrida's doctorat d'état, and appears in 1967 as nothing less than a breakthrough into a discursive field dominated by structuralism. As the early essay "Structure, Sign, and Play" makes clear, structuralism presupposes the totality of the sense of the system it studies and conceives it as structured by laws. In the structure as structuralism 'fantasizes' about it there is a center that remains constant despite the permutation or the substitution of elements. Challenging the structuralist thesis, Derrida not only proposed a new conception of structure as de-centered, but also a new way of conceiving that which remains the same in the structure. Sameness no longer meant the identity of structural laws, but reiteration of writing, repetition productive of difference.

What is the question to which Of Grammatology would be the answer? I take this question to be something like: "How should the history of sense be studied in the epoch, in which metaphysics comes to closure?" Derrida uses the Heideggerian language of metaphysical closure and declares a new epoch. In this epoch the task is to read off, from the history of sense, the play of writing in virtue of which the complex relations of belonging to and breaking up with the history of Western metaphysics could be made manifest. Derrida claims that a tradition could only be disturbed and transformed in its constitutive hierarchies, if one manages to inhabit it in a certain way, i.e., in the deconstructive way. Following an enigmatic Exergue that determines the very place of Of Grammatology in the history of sense, Derrida takes up examples to show how Jean Jacques Rousseau, Claude Levi-Strauss, and Ferdinand de Saussure belong to the tradition they put in question, by making discursive gestures that belong to the logocentric and phonocentric metaphysics of presence. The difficult 'Exergue' is the place for an enigmatic relation to Heidegger: Without him, it would have been impossible to speak of the unity of metaphysics, and the possibility of the beginning of a new epoch. Even though he outlined the closure of metaphysics, according to Derrida, he still belongs to metaphysics because of the logocentrism at work in his thinking. Heidegger could not see the new epoch that is dawning upon us, i.e., the epoch of writing.

As is well known, Of Grammatology claims that in the history of metaphysics writing is read as threat, dead, exterior, and fallen. He argues that the privilege given through logocentric and phonocentric assumptions has always been undermined, haunted, supplemented by "the signifier of the signifier." He used the expression "the signifier of the signifier" as another name for that iterable origin, a matrix of play that precedes presence and absence of the signified world of things and of concepts, meanings as of the sensible and the intelligible realms. At times Derrida speaks of the "appearance" of this play. Différance can be taken as hinting at the equiprimordiality of the concealment and the unconcealment of this play. Derrida often speaks of play as apparent because the play is that of a non-dialectizable "radical materiality" or historicity; and yet its movement could be taken as negligible or dispensable by the history of metaphysics in the face of what it produces, i.e., sense. The play of writing is the movement of this radical materiality that is the condition of both the possibility and the impossibility of all infinitisation. That is Derrida's way of inscribing finitude or death, at the origin of temporality, in terms of which the Heideggerian meaning of Being is articulated. What are the hermeneutical implications of this thesis? Derrida suggests that reading should free itself from the classical categories of history, "and perhaps above all, from the categories of the history of philosophy" (Of Grammatology, lxxxix).

As Royle rightly notes, Of Grammatology is polyphonous; it has multiple voices: On the one hand, it is dry and formal. It is a thesis written for the French Academia, dominated on occasion by an authoritarian I and the most inclusive we. Avowedly, it respects classical norms, the constitutive protocols of what it studies. Thus it requires from the reader the most normative attentiveness and traditional respect for grammar, syntax, argument and demonstration. On the other hand, it involves a notoriously delirious tone and calls our attention to that which is "bizarre" as it goes on between the lines, in hidden spaces. This polyphony of rational order and delirium is perhaps the underlying reason why we have found Derrida's philosophy so attractive.

Practicing the science of writing, doing the grammatology of Of Grammatology could have been about pointing to the oddities of Derrida's own text. Reading Derrida's Of Grammatology is a valuable book because it enables us to think through that which remains enigmatic in our own first reception of Derrida's work.