Reading Descartes Otherwise: Blind, Mad, Dreamy, and Bad

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Kyoo Lee, Reading Descartes Otherwise: Blind, Mad, Dreamy, and Bad, Fordham University Press, 2013, 219pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823244850.

Reviewed by Dennis L. Sepper, University of Dallas


Has Descartes never been modern? The most appropriate end to postmodernism and its methods -- postmodernism is not, after all, simply anti-modern, so it should not be surprising that it has its typical methods -- might be, as suggested by Bruno Latour, a dissolution of the very idea that anyone at all has been modern. To put the notion a bit more moderately, in substantive ways modernity is no simple matter of historical reality but a long-cultivated construction of intellectual history and philosophical historiography. Thus, if postmodernism as a movement is about to pass away or pass over into something else, the moment has come to ask whether even the father of modernity is finally ready to be seen as nonmodern or amodern -- or at least not simply and solely modern.

Kyoo Lee argues that it is time to read Descartes otherwise. Her aim is less to set old historiography right than to pick up his works ("overread and underexplored," 1) and read him afresh, in order to make him our contemporary. She largely sets aside older historiography and instead takes her bearings from recent (and, to defenders of the older historiography, eccentric) debates and discussions, like the Foucault-Derrida contest over the body of Cartesian rationality or Dalia Judowitz's and Susan Bordo's intepretations of the sources and destiny of Cartesian subjectivity. Her "guiding concern" is "what happens between clear and distinct ideas or, literally, paragraphed thoughts" (12, emphasis in original). She explores the Descartes who is thinking feelingly, "while leaving the feeling part folded in for a moment (maybe for another book)," (20 -- perhaps pointing to the book's final phrase, "To Be Continued . . ." 181).

The new bearings lead to a new attitude. That last word has to be taken with subtlety, although there is plenty of "attitude" in the book, in particular impatience with careworn interpretations and pride in striking out on new paths that allow Lee to think for herself. Just like Descartes, one might say. The book is nothing if not spirited, and also, at times, irritating, wrongheaded, and illuminating. It is never obtuse or simply blind. Lee, who teaches comparative literature as well as philosophy, is nothing if not attentive to Descartes's rhetoric, understanding that term in its deep historical/philosophical sense rather than the pejorative colloquial one, and to his poetics as well. That is, she sees Descartes as responsive to a situation and an audience, as writing up the philosophical situation with art.

The irritations derive chiefly from the manner, or manneredness, of parts of the book. Lee's intellectual punning has more misses than hits ("re-haunt-ologizing," "'reason-unreason' duelity"), her handling of Latin is wobbly ("ego conquiro" read as "I conquer" -- granted that she is following the reading of another writer, but there are other examples), and there is the occasional gaffe (Aldous Huxley as the author of an 1870 remark by his grandfather T. H. Huxley) missed by author, readers, and editors. When she is riffing on mood, her own or others', without direct reference to specific passages or questions (often in introducing and concluding her themes and sections), the jokes-to-self and the easily correctable mistakes are all the more annoying.

But there is a good deal to be gained if one is willing to let go of annoyance. The overall concept/conceit of Lee's book is dramatic: the divisions of the work are "stage setting" (preceded by two "preambles") followed by four "scenes." The latter term refers in the first instance to episodes in Descartes's works, chiefly the First Meditation of Meditations: the blind man making his way with a walking stick (from Dioptrics, one of the three scientific essays to which the Discourse is preface), the madman believing his head is made of glass, the dreamer every night experiencing fantasies like the madman's, and the worried navigation of thought between God and evil genius. These are the "blind," "mad," "dreamy," and "(good and) bad" of the subtitle.

Each of the four scenes has its specific rationale and method. In the first, Lee interrogates, both appreciatively and critically, Merleau-Ponty's interpretations of Descartes and his use of metaphor. To the predominant tendency to take as preeminent the visual model of Cartesian understanding, Lee contrasts the figure of the blind man in the Dioptrics using a stick to feel and "see" the qualities and character of the things around him. "The foundational primacy of not only tactility but tactile vision, as illustrated in this chain of prosthetic self-reflections, remains a Cartesian truth, however possibly startling" (58). Although I doubt that this is startling to recent Descartes scholarship -- witness Stephen Gaukroger's claim that we need to read Descartes's theory as causal-mechanical with respect to transmission but linguistically or signitively with respect to representation (Descartes' System of Natural Philosophy (2002), 206) -- it is nevertheless an important point to make against the lazy practice of conventional historiography.

But then the remainder of scene 1 goes off on a tangent motivated more by a disagreement with Merleau-Ponty than by reading Descartes. Lee resists Merleau-Ponty's inclination to use the model of painting to understand Cartesian perception in favor of photography, and she here draws on Catherine Malabou, Roland Barthes, Estelle Jussim, and other theorists of photography as allies. Yet this quarrel may be moot (never mind whether the preferred model should be photography or video) not simply because the idea or representation is signitive but even more because Lee does not read sufficiently otherwise the typical understanding of "clear and distinct idea."

Except for a handful of occurrences -- granted that the handful is in the very prominent location of the Fourth Meditation -- Descartes characterizes not ideas as clear and distinct, but perception, thinking, seeing, and other cognitive acts. If the usual phrasing quickly became commonplace in Descartes's followers and in later figures like Spinoza and Leibniz, it is important to recognize that Descartes never thought of clarity and distinctness as properties of ideas per se (which are the forms of given thought, according to the geometrical-style demonstration in the Meditations' second set of replies to objections). One does not simply pop a fixed and pregiven image or thought-form into the mind and then contemplate it clearly and distinctly. Even if there is a distinctive form there that you thought perfectly clearly the previous day, you still need to focus and direct the mind today in order to "work" the idea so that the mind can reachieve clear and distinct perceiving. The sharpest photographic image in the world is not going to be perceived clearly and distinctly if you look at it in a dreamy state of mind.

The second scene begins with the Foucault-Derrida controversy about reason and unreason in Descartes. Because Lee also examines a wide range of passages in Descartes regarding the trope of madness, this scene does the kind of reading that really does get at a different Descartes than the one of conventional historiography. For all the respect she gives to Foucault -- and a great deal of the scene deals directly with him -- she shows that even if Descartes's philosophy contributed to the proscription of madness (and the mad) to rationally controlling institutions and reservations, his purpose in invoking the mad in the First Meditation is neither the imposition of hegemonic reason nor mere rhetorical flourish. In the end, Foucault's treatment of him is "shockingly interesting and yet slightly hysterical" (96), and Descartes's rationalism turns out not to be as violent as Foucault claims. Whereas the latter makes out Descartes's turn inward as a "normativized, compulsive folding back" marked by "repression and exclusion," Lee, tracing Descartes's rhetoric and poetics of madness in the First Meditation, finds it to be "liberating and open-ended" (103).

In a gesture that points toward the third scene, Lee begins paying special attention to the meditator's expostulation at the end of his presentation of the madman: "if I applied anything from them to my own example I would seem no less mad (demens) than they. Immediately the meditator adds, with an irony clearly aimed at himself: "Praeclare sane," "most clearly sound in mind"! The Cottingham et al. translation renders this adequately as "A brilliant piece of reasoning!", the century-old Haldane and Ross translation suppresses it, and the Descartes-approved French translation by the Duc de Luynes gave a noncommittal "toutefois." Of course twentieth century philosophers, especially English-speaking ones, did not always hone their sensibility for irony, especially self-directed irony. With passages like this Lee's techniques of reading otherwise do their best work. She decides to call what is going on "jazzy turns of thought, which shape the internal structure and rhythm of the Meditations as a whole" (111). Her success suggests further (though she does not) that it might be worth the effort to raise again the question why Descartes titled the work as he did. There was a long prehistory, strategy, and rhetorical/poetic tradition of meditation that the historiography about Descartes tends to forget as soon as it is raised.

Lee's turn in scene 3 to the dream-trope of Meditation 1 focuses more on how dreams operate in Descartes's writings than on the debates of philosophers and scholars. The staple topic of how dreaming can be distinguished from waking is by and large set aside ("I am interested in old questions but not in repeating them"), not least "because Descartes himself, as we will see shortly, became weary of that brain teaser" (124). If Lee in my view makes a misstep early on by imposing the rubric "sleepwalking" on the various occurrences of dreams in Descartes's writings, this turns out to be only a temporary misdirection. She argues that, and illustrates how, the "philosophy of the cogito, seen more intimately, is dream-friendly or integrated" (125). She calls on the dream narratives that helped shape his early career and notes, contrasting the sharp, knowledge-inciting strokes of poetic imagination to the plodding extraction of cognition through philosophic reason to explicate their significance. More generally she characterizes his use of method as more pragmatic than rationalist and highlights his acceptance of the finite human mind as dependent on an "interplay between the irrational and the rational" (134). Appealing to the lessons Descartes draws -- about sleep, dreams, imagination, passions, and the limits of human nature -- in diverse sources (correspondence, the unfinished dialogue Search for the Truth, and his still insufficiently appreciated last book, The Passions of the Soul), she highlights a "Cartesian poetics of imagination" (145) that is more basic than the rationalism to which he has been historiographically consigned.

The concluding scene 4 is rather more about Descartes's God, the Cartesian circle, and Descartes's confusions in claiming certitude ("Is Descartes being confused? Yes and no," (153)) than about the evil genius. It twists and turns rapidly from text to text (Descartes's and others', old, recent, and contemporary), and along with the introductory "Stage Setting" is the part of Lee's book that falls most frequently into overwrought postmodern idiom. (For example: "This dualized reservation of and for God, this 'separation' of 'God' and God (or from God) is an act of turning God into a kind of ontonomological 'sticker' or labeled lid," (168).) On the other hand, more than in the other scenes of the book, Lee accomplishes here a more standard "coverage" of passages and themes at issue in conventional historiography while reading them in an unconventional way.

Lee characterizes Descartes as shifting from narrated to authorial ego, playing the semi-playful game of someone semi-confused and partially-masked, approximately in the spirit of a Sterne or a Montaigne. But she understands this as coming about because Descartes is wrestling with real problems, especially the evil genius and the God who is supposed to deliver the meditator from his thought tensions and confusions. Because Lee's writing is so highly impressionistic as it nears the end, and because she engages in what might be called "drive-by interpretation" using passages from late-twentieth-century critics, it is hard to draw entirely satisfactory or even clear conclusions. Nancy, Adorno, Marion, Kristeva, Barthes, Blumenberg, Frankfurt, Judovitz, Negri, Kolakowski, Bourdieu, Blanchot, Ricoeur and many others make cameo appearances. Peter Kreeft's imaginary dialogue between Socrates and Descartes, quickly convicting the latter of logical boneheadedness with regard to essence and existence (161-2), shows Kreeft's (and Lee's?) inclination to see Descartes as a semi-competent forerunner of Spinoza than actually revealing anything about how he conceived the being of God versus the being of the finite thinking things we humans are.

It seems to me that, especially after Marion's decades-long pursuit of what Descartes thought -- legitimately -- was the properly proper name of God, one ought not to bother bringing up the arguments of the Third Meditation without wrestling with the problem of infinity. The thinkers of the late sixteenth and the early seventeenth centuries were already alert to the elusive grandeur of positive infinity, and if they did not achieve Cantorian articulateness, at least some of them recognized infinity as a problem like no other. In this sense Lee gets an anxious and unsettled Descartes rather than an awestruck one, a thinker who dances with, but more often around, disturbing questions. He thus is read as a more twenty-first-century persona than a seventeenth-century, much less a perennial, one. That falls short of reading him otherwise enough.