Reading Hegel's Phenomenology

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John Russon, Reading Hegel's Phenomenology, Indiana University Press, 2004, 320 pp., $27.95 (pbk), 0253216923.

Reviewed by John McCumber, University of California, Los Angeles


No book calls for commentary more than Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. Its dark and twisted sentences, 493 pages of them in A. V. Miller's now standard translation, have defeated expounders for generations, and the same failures recur with depressing frequency. Some achieve comprehensibility by leaving Hegel's actual pages behind, as did John Findlay; others remain close to the text, and as incomprehensible as Hegel -- the fate, among others, of Howard Kainz. The sheer number of Hegelian pages also challenges the commentator. Does she attempt a detailed exposition, in which case she will not get very far -- like Werner Marx, who in decades of teaching Hegel never made it beyond the Introduction? Or does she resort to brutal summary, as does Walter Kaufmann?[1]

John Russon has chosen a different, and more promising, path. He seeks to help readers understand the Phenomenology not by beginning from Hegel's passages and then rewording them, but by thinking through some of the basic issues in the Phenomenology in such a way that the reader becomes familiar with them before turning to Hegel's own tortured treatments. Russon also chooses his issues from different places along the pathway of the Phenomenology, so that the whole book is eventually discussed, but always from the perspective of a particular section or set of sections.

This book thus maintains far more distance from the Phenomenology than would a traditional commentary. Close reading does occur, notably in Chapters 1, on "Sense-Certainty," 3, on "Force and Understanding," and 7, on Stoicism and skepticism. But most of the book's chapters are in fact original works of philosophy in their own right. Because they are always keyed to specific sections of the Phenomenology, however, the reader who has worked through Russon's sometimes difficult, though always elegant, prose will be in a good position to get something out of Hegel himself.

Central to Russon's reading of Hegel is a concept that Hegel discusses very little (p. 54): that of the body as "our living practical capacity for engagement with the world" (p. 55). This body, kin to the "lived body" of phenomenologists such as Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, is the point of contact between the I and the not-I -- "the point at which my passive undergoing of the real is my active expression of myself" (p. 20).

The first part of the Phenomenology, "Consciousness," is thus structured like Kant's Third Antinomy, which argues that in order to see all things as passively caused I must see some things as actively free, and in order to see some things as free I must see all things as caused:

The immediate -- and compelling -- recognition of ourselves as passive in some sense requires us to develop our cognition to the point of the comprehensive understanding of determinateness, which means being active and acknowledging ourselves as active… . Similarly, the immediate -- and compelling -- recognition of ourselves as active … requires us to develop our activity to the point of being passive to the determining power of the other. (p. 69).

It is crucial for Russon's Hegel -- though not for Kant -- that the free being in this antinomical structure be, ineluctably and from the start, ourselves as embodied subjects; for embodiment, as our capacity for active engagement with the world, is just this dialectic of activity and passivity. Thus, in "Sense-Certainty," the fleeting "now" becomes comprehensible only when we constitute it as a "temporal whole," or what Hegel calls a "universal" (p. 17). In "Perception," we can only understand individual things by seeing them as necessitated; this means, as Leibniz saw, seeing them as essentially participants in the metaphysical system of all reality -- a reality which also, however, contains our efforts to understand it, efforts which must themselves also be necessitated: "That reality is a systematic process of working to realize itself as self-comprehending reason is thus a view to which anyone who perceives things is committed" (p. 34).

In "Force and Understanding" we discover that "… only for understanding [can there] be a cause, and therefore the identity of the cause cannot be understood outside the context of understanding itself" (p. 52). In "Desire," consciousness realizes that the context of understanding is an interpersonal context: objectivity requires conforming to another's desire -- as the bondsman conforms to the master's (p. 64).

Conforming to the other requires comprehensive and self-critical reinterpretation of the other -- the kind of self-critical hermeneutics that both Creon and Antigone, in "The Ethical Order," fatally reject (pp. 75-80). Understanding this kind of "absolute reading" shows how modern epistemology, which begins from a Stoic conception of the self as distinct from the world (p. 99), leads to a view of the investigating self as carrying out a skeptical process which aims at a "reconciliation" with the world (p. 108).

In attempting that reconciliation in the Phenomenology's section on "Reason," however, consciousness wrongly accepts three dualisms. "Observing Reason" takes reason to be opposed to nature; "Self-Alienated Spirit" sees it as opposed to, or as strictly identical with, the social institutions which constitute "Culture;" and "Spirit Certain of Itself" sees reason as victimized by the dualism between action and intention, plagued by the fact that the ways we express our intentions and act on them recoil back on those intentions themselves (p. 116).

This leads to Hegel's climactic confrontation with Kantian ethics. Such ethics confronts a dualism between our rationality, which feels the obligation to be autonomous reason, and our empirical selves, which must act in specific natural and social circumstances (p. 153). The way out of this final dualism is to see that reason is "not a set of formal rules for performing operations on any self-identical content" but "the very intelligibility of what is real." (p. 155). Reason grasps things not as simply self-identical instances of general laws but as "dynamic structures of self-opposition" (p.51).

Reason is thus the comprehending activity -- and the self-comprehending activity -- of a concrete, and so embodied, being: it is "phenomenological" (p. 155), not merely in the standard Hegelian sense, but in that of the later phenomenologists whom we call "existentialists."

Embodied reason, Heidegger argued, first experiences the world in an unthematized, "habitual" way. For Hegel such unthematized, repeated engagement is Sittlichkeit (p. 173). Sittlichkeit, for Russon is ritualistic in nature, for a ritual is "an intelligent act which conceals its intelligibility from its practitioner" (p. 175). This in turn makes Sittlichkeit religious, for religion -- again in Russon's own definition -- is simply the set of "rituals in and through which we primarily establish a confirmed identity as a member of a community" (p. 177). Religion, so understood, is the basis for science in Hegel's (or Russon's) sense, i.e. as seeking to disclose our own concrete reality to us; science opposes religion only when it asserts that the reflective individual, the scientific self, is basic (p. 178). When such disclosure is carried out in absolute knowing, consciousness "actually behaves according to the laws that it believes animate its behavior" (p. 167).

It is at this point that Russon comes upon, and fails to solve, a perennial problem for commentators on the Phenomenology: what is its relation to the Science of Logic, and to the philosophies of nature and spirit which follow that?

Russon first argues that the Phenomenology is implicitly metaphysics in that, throughout it, ontological claims are paired with epistemological stances: "Each shape is experienced by us as a paired structure of subjective comportment and metaphysical commitment" (p. 222-223). This pairing, however, is unbalanced, because in the Phenomenology metaphysical commitments are understood as projected by us, rather than as they are in themselves (p. 224).

The Logic takes metaphysical commitments themselves as its objects. The two books thus complement one another:

Without the Logic, the Phenomenology is inconclusive, for it produces only an external reflection on being, without having demonstrated that being has shown itself to be as the Phenomenology demands; similarly the Logic on its own is inconclusive, for it produces only an external reflection on the nature of subjectivity, without having shown that subjectivity on its own account shows itself to be absolute being (pp. 226f).

This final section -- less than eight pages long -- raises many more questions than it answers.

*If the Phenomenology "pairs" subjectivity and metaphysics, how does the subjective side come to dominate in such a way that a later metaphysics is required?

*If being in the Phenomenology is what consciousness projects, how can the book be an "external reflection" on it?

*Why, on the other hand, must there be more to metaphysics than what the Phenomenology treats? Maybe metaphysics just is a set of subjective comportments.

*If the Phenomenology is an external reflection on being, why does being -- what Hegel calls the "in-itself" -- so consistently show itself not to be what consciousness projects?

*If the Phenomenology and the Logic give different weights to experience and being, how can Hegel say that "pure science presupposes liberation from the opposition of consciousness?"[2] Such liberation would leave nothing to balance off.

*In several places in the beginning of his Logic, Hegel says that the Logic moves on from the Phenomenology; but for Russon they are the "same project" (p. 225).

*Finally, Hegel says that at the beginning of the Logic "philosophy" is an empty word, or has merely arbitrary meanings (SL 73); but for Russon it has a very determinate nature and task.

The Phenomenology, then, has kept some of its most important secrets. But that hardly keeps John Russon's book from being an important and illuminating meditation on some of its most important lessons.

[1] J. N. Findlay, Hegel: A Re-examination, London: Allen & Unwin, 1958; Howard P. Kainz, Hegel's Phenomenology, Part I, Tuscaloosa, Alabama: The University of Alabama Press, 1976; Part II, Athens, Ohio: The University of Ohio Press, 1983; Walter Kaufmann, Hegel: A Reinterpretation , Garden City: Anchor Books, 1966; Werner Marx, Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, New York: Harper & Row, 1975.

[2] Hegel, Science of Logic, (A. V. Miller, trans.) New York: Humanities Press, 1976, p. 49.