Reading Kant's Lectures

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Robert R. Clewis (ed.), Reading Kant's Lectures, De Gruyter, 2015, 608pp., $210.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783110342321.

Reviewed by Stefano Bacin, Università San Raffaele, Milano


This volume's aim is to present a state-of-the-art examination of the philosophical value of the texts documenting Kant's teaching in the various philosophical disciplines through four decades. Other books have recently been devoted to specific sets of lectures, notably on moral philosophy and on anthropology.[1] Rather than focusing on a specific discipline, this volume covers the entire range of disciplines taught by Kant, as reflected in the available student notes: metaphysics, logic, moral philosophy, anthropology, pedagogy, philosophical encyclopedia, natural rights, natural theology, mathematics, physics, and physical geography.

The interest in this special material is as old as the interest in Kant's philosophy. Before attracting the attention of later scholars, the student notes from Kant's courses had already attracted the attention of Kant's contemporaries. As reported by various sources, those interested in his philosophy but unable to attend his lectures in remote Königsberg purchased notes taken by his students. The turning point in the history of the longstanding interest in Kant's lectures and the peculiar sources that document them was the decision to devote a section of the Academy edition to the lecture notes, notes which previous editors had regarded as merely spurious. The publication of new texts, both within and outside the Academy edition, has always renewed interest in the lectures. This happened with the publication of the lectures on anthropology (1997), the first volume of those on physical geography (2009), the Kaehler notes of the moral philosophy course and, more recently, a revised edition of the Feyerabend notes on natural law.[2] The timeliness of Clewis's volume is mainly owed to the almost complete publication of English translations of many selected lecture notes of all disciplines within the Cambridge Edition of Kant's works (the volume including the translation of the notes on natural right is imminent). These translations have made available such important materials to a larger audience of scholars worldwide and should be regarded as a further significant step in affirming their importance. The present volume can thus be seen as belonging to this further phase of engagement with the documents of Kant's teaching activity. Here it would be impossible to discuss the whole range of topics dealt with in all chapters. Instead of commenting on each, I will focus on the different ways in which, and with what success, the chapters contribute to the general purpose of providing a guide for reading Kant's lectures.

In the introduction, Robert R. Clewis provides a helpful overview of the distinctive features of the lecture notes and presents the main issues regarding their proper use. Summing up the essential results of the scholarship since the late nineteenth century, Clewis rightly observes that a "rigid separation between Kant's teaching and writing seems to be too strong" and that the once common "assertion of a 'double life'" is not persuasive (p. 11). If the lecture notes document Kant's teaching activity, it would not be appropriate to separate that from his philosophical development. As many chapters of this volume show, Kant taught as a philosopher. Because of their different status from genuine Kant writings, however, the student notes from Kant's lectures pose serious methodological issues. The notes are neither published by Kant, nor directly composed by Kant speaking in the first person, but students' notes of mostly uncertain date that report the remarks of a university professor teaching materials by other authors.  So the lecture notes cannot be read and interpreted as straightforwardly as Kant's own work, but require the reader to be aware of their peculiar features. For this reason, the chapters that directly engage with the relevant methodological questions are the most successful since they not merely present an analysis of some arguments present in some passages of the lectures, but provide an example of how to approach these texts. If, as non-authentic texts, the lecture notes do not stand alone, this limitation is to be compensated for by relying on their connections with other texts (both Kant's and other authors'). As several chapters show, an examination of the lectures can be most fruitful when the lectures are considered along with the published writings, Kant's private notes (the so-called Reflexionen published in the volumes 14 to 19 of the Academy Edition), as well as with the textbooks on which Kant lectured. Where this does not happen, the lecture notes ultimately only provide interesting suggestions.

The relationship between Kant's exposition in the lectures and the textbook of the relevant discipline poses specific issues, though. Because the exposition more or less closely followed the textbook, the students' notes can appear "often a mixture of his own views and those of the textbook author" (p. 4). In this regard, Clewis refers approvingly to Max Wundt's suggestion that "the fact that Kant used a textbook . . . is bound to give the lecture notes a more dogmatic flavor" (p. 13). At the same time, though, Clewis also remarks that "the key, in a given case, is to figure out what components make up the mix" (p. 13), which can certainly be difficult, but is not impossible. This entails, however, that the alleged dogmatic flavour of the student notes' is in fact merely apparent. In contrast with what Clewis seems to suggest, the combination or rather the confrontation of different views in Kant's comments on the textbooks gives the lectures a strikingly dialogic character which is often disguised by the fact that Kant's criticisms of the views presented in the textbooks are often not explicitly reported as such. This is especially pointed out by Steve Naragon with regard to some examples in the metaphysics lectures (cf. p. 61). The main obstacle to a full appreciation of this confrontation is, of course, that the views argued for by the authors of the textbooks have to be carefully taken into account.[3] In spite of its crucial importance for the appraisal of the lectures, Kant's intense critical dialogue with the authors of the textbooks has unfortunately been neglected in many chapters in this collection. Those which devote more attention to this present a helpfully nuanced and dynamic portrait of Kant's thought.

This holds especially for the early chapters, devoted to the lectures on metaphysics. Naragon's rigorous chapter highlights, with regard to the special topic of real grounds, the intense confrontation between various views that emerges from Kant's early metaphysics lectures, which are much different from a more dogmatic presentation of supposedly uncontroversial theses. The merits of Naragon's chapter, however, go beyond the specific topics of the metaphysics lectures, since his methodological remarks on the peculiar features of Herder's notes hold also for the other notes by Herder on logic, moral philosophy, and mathematics. Naragon helpfully summarizes upsides and downsides that are distinctive of Herder's notes in comparison with the others: they are the only texts documenting Kant's teaching in the 1760s, they stem directly from the classroom without successive elaboration by different hands, and they require special caution because of Herder's own insertion and, especially, because of the limits of the editorial work done on the publication of Herder's notes in volume 28 of the Academy edition.

The discussion in play in Kant's critical assessment of the views presented in the textbooks is also given careful consideration by Courtney D. Fugate who focuses on how the metaphysics lectures shed light on the development of Kant's conception of metaphysics from the 1770s up to the full Critical phase. A central role in this process is played by his increasing dissatisfaction with Baumgarten's definition of metaphysics as the "science of the first principles in human knowledge" (cf. p. 72). As Fugate remarks, Kant's eventual rejection of that definition does not lead to a rejection of the definiendum, but to an exploration in a different direction, pointing towards a "science of the principles of pure cognition" (cf. p. 81).

How Kant's discussion combines agreement with Baumgarten on some points with significant disagreement on others also clearly emerges in Corey W. Dyck's treatment of the proofs of immortality in the metaphysics lectures. Dyck shows that Kant accepts Baumgarten's understanding of the thesis of the soul's immortality as claiming the necessity of life after the death of the body, as opposed to the view of a merely contingent life after death. However, Kant departs from Baumgarten in rejecting a theological-moral proof of immortality, like any other a posteriori or a priori strict demonstrations. Dyck highlights that Kant, in spite of his rejection of all proofs, acknowledged the importance of a teleological argument that draws on the purposefulness of every part of a living being. He held that, while it could not provide any certainty, it "can never be refuted" either (cf. p. 128). The lectures provide larger evidence than the Paralogisms for Kant's use of the teleological view, which he understood as entailing the necessity of assuming not only that the soul will survive corporeal death, but also that the soul will maintain the capacity to carry out its activity even in the absence of bodily organs. Through this example, Dyck makes a good case for the significance of the discussions recorded in the lecture notes as supplements to the theses argued for in the published writings. Similarly Dennis Schulting's accurate chapter, which also focuses on the metaphysics lectures, examines the relationship between the concepts of consciousness and apperception as it emerges from the lecture notes. Schulting convincingly insists on the connection between Kant's view and the Wolffian conception of self-consciousness as a representation of one's representations.

Huaping Lu-Adler  discusses further methodological issues arising from the lectures notes in her chapter about the logic lectures. As Lu-Adler remarks, a secure use of the lectures is made difficult by the uncertainty regarding the dates of both the lectures and Kant's marginal notes in his personal copies of the textbooks. Lu-Adler's reasonable proposal for a fruitful use of the material included in the lectures is that, in spite of all uncertainty, we can first "outline the parameters for a possible Kantian answer" (p. 157) to a specific problem drawing on the published writings, and then a developmental perspective on that problem from the unpublished texts. She provides an example of how this approach can be implemented, focusing on the issues of the so-called Metaphysical Deduction of the pure concepts of understanding. Her suggestion might be further substantiated by including a careful consideration of the relevant textbook.

The section devoted to the logic lectures includes also a chapter by Riccardo Pozzo, which provides further information regarding the institutional context of the practice of teaching in a university like Königsberg in Kant's time. Although the chapter's title is "Kant's Latin in Class", Kant's use of Latin in his teaching is only the last topic Pozzo touches on. After having stressed the importance of Kant's use of Georg Friedrich Meier's textbook in his courses, he surprisingly notes that "Kant did not write anything on practical, i.e. epistemic logic" (p. 168). Pozzo is certainly right in pointing out the broad range of topics covered in Meier's treatment, in comparison with Kant's different perspective. But considering Kant's great attention to the role of practical logic would have strengthened his case. As Kant scholars have often pointed out (following Kant's indication in the Critique of Pure Reason) practical logic gave him the decisive clue for developing what he calls a "doctrine of method".

Methodological remarks like Lu-Adler's are especially important because they apply to the other disciplines as well. The significance of the lectures can become especially apparent if we focus on a theme throughout the diachronical development of Kant's thought. Oliver Sensen shows how this approach can be fruitfully followed also outside the boundaries of logic. Drawing on a brief overview of the extant students' notes on ethics, Sensen goes through them mapping the main changes in Kant's view on the content and the source of the principle of morality. Here the lectures are regarded as displaying a path towards Kant's theory of the autonomy of the will. Sensen plausibly suggests that the most significant changes in the development of Kant's view regard the source of the moral principle and moral motivation, which reached its mature version only shortly before the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals.

The other chapter devoted to the lectures in moral philosophy, by Faustino Fabbianelli, deals with Kant's view on moral imputation. Fabbianelli only employs some of the lectures in order to highlight a contrast between two understandings of imputation. How Kant's remarks relate to the views presented in the textbooks might have been helpful in clarifying the issue, but unfortunately they are not taken into consideration.[4] According to Fabbianelli's reading, Kant would ultimately switch between these views depending on whether he takes "a transcendental perspective" or "the perspective of an applied philosophy" (p. 219). This suggestion, however, strikes me as unconvincingly based on a rather artificial, unwarranted distinction between perspectives.

The other main academic discipline of practical philosophy, natural law, is dealt with in two chapters. Günter Zöller handles the crucial topic of the bindingness of norms. As he notes, Kant's treatment of the issue explicitly rejects the view of Gottfried Achenwall's textbook. Zöller considers the natural law notes by Feyerabend against the backdrop of the history of jurisprudence in ancient Europe (to which he devotes most of his chapter). Frederick Rauscher, however, compares the views expressed in the 1784 lectures with Kant's later writings to show that the events of 1789 in France appear to have led Kant to re-think his view on the nature of sovereignty in a way that sound much like an ex post justification of the Revolution. Making this interpretive proposal quite plausible, Rauscher's compelling analysis thus offers another example of a thematically focused investigation that shows how the lectures can prove crucial in understanding the development of Kant's thought.

I have stressed that the relationship between Kant's lectures and the views defended in the textbooks is a crucial feature of the lectures. If that is the case, in one chapter in particular the connection between Kant's course and the corresponding textbook gains a marked importance, since it is discussed as a possible key to understanding the project of the course itself. The case at issue is that of the fascinating lectures on "Philosophical Encyclopedia", examined in John Zammito's chapter. Kant's lectures on philosophical encyclopedia, which include material of great significance, especially regarding Kant's conception of philosophy, present a puzzle to the reader, because Kant has apparently taught that class only for a few years between 1767 and 178. Neither the reasons why he undertook it nor the reasons why he discontinued it are entirely clear. Furthermore, the knowledge of the contents of that course rely on only a single student transcript, published in vol. 29 of the Academy edition. As he had already argued in a previous work, Zammito suggests that that course represents Kant's commitment to the project of a popular philosophy, and that the abandonment of the course of philosophical encyclopedia marks Kant's departure from popular philosophy in favor of his new critical project.[5] Zammito rightly points out that in the lectures on philosophical encyclopedia Kant rejected a merely speculative conception of philosophy, insisting that philosophy has rather to do with the "vocation of man", which is not primarily theoretical. So for Zammito, the Kant teaching philosophical encyclopedia was "very much on the side of Popular philosophy against the school philosophy personified by Wolff" (p. 314). That Kant held the course of philosophical encyclopedia on a work of a prominent popular philosopher, Johann Georg Heinrich Feder, would be, Zammito argues, an important clue that suggests that Kant thereby intended to back up the project of a popular philosophy.

This interpretation is too one-sided, though. Most of the themes pointed out by Zammito in Kant's treatment of the philosophical encyclopedia -- a decidedly practical view of the "vocation of man" and the purpose of the faculties of the mind, an insistence on the importance of a worldly education, and a close connection between philosophical activity and the aesthetic qualities of artistic creativity -- were widespread not only among popular philosophers, but also in the so-called third generation of Wolffians, as shown in the writings of another of Kant's authors, Georg Friedrich Meier, which pre-dated Feder's. Zammito also contends that the very title of the course, "philosophical encyclopedia", should be regarded as conveying a commitment to popular philosophy, since it "would have of necessity invoked associations with the great French endeavor of Diderot and D'Alembert" (p. 307 f.). But the suggestion is not entirely convincing either. The mere idea of an encyclopedia cannot be taken to entail a commitment to the project inspired by the French philosophes, if only because a significant German tradition going back at least to Johann Heinrich Alsted had conceived an encyclopedia as an exposition providing an "overview of the whole", just as Kant explains at the beginning of his lectures (cf. p. 312). Interestingly, one of the main authors on which Kant based his courses, Baumgarten, who is certainly not suspected of being close to popular philosophy in the sense meant by Zammito, had also accepted that idea and offered encyclopedic courses.[6] However, even if his interpretive suggestions do not strike me as convincing, Zammito makes an important methodological point in paying such attention to the relation between Kant's encyclopedia lectures and the relevant textbook. Indeed, the dialogical nature of that relationship is apparent also in these lectures, since, as Zammito observes, they also include "an utter rejection of the Feder program" (p. 317) with Kant's thesis that "the canon of logic is not derived from experience" (29:14, cf. p. 317).

The not merely academic purposes of Kant's teaching are one main focus in the chapters about the lectures on natural theology. Stephen R. Palmquist investigates the relevance of pedagogical themes in the Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason and in the lectures. Drawing on a remark in the preface to the Religion where Kant mentions the idea of "a special course on pure philosophical doctrine of religion" (6:10, cf. p. 366 f.), Palmquist suggests that there is no mere continuity between the courses and the later published work, as the Religion in fact aimed at replacing the traditional course. In Palmquist's view, by teaching natural theology, Kant should have recognized the necessity of "a new academic discipline" (p. 369) more adequate to the not merely academic task of providing a philosophical training for theologians and clergy. The Religion was intended to provide the first textbook of that discipline. In light of this thought-provoking interpretation, the significance of the lectures would not be limited to the specific aspects of Kant's view of religion, but would directly affect the understanding of his entire project in philosophy of religion. Palmquist's insistence on the discontinuity between the lectures and the Religion finds an interesting contrast with the next chapter, by Norbert Fischer who tends to downplay the differences. Fischer holds that the purpose of "pastoral care" is even more evident in the lectures than in the published work (cf. p. 405). One remarkable difference separating the presentation in lectures from the Religion, namely that the lectures contain "no explicit references to Christianity" (p. 404), does not suggest, for Fischer, any significant change in Kant's philosophical project, but simply that "these lectures presuppose a Christian background as self-evident", which does not strike me as an entirely convincing explanation.

The lectures on pedagogy are a special case. they, unlike the other lectures, are known to us not through students' notes, but through a text compiled by Friedrich Gottlob Rink and published during Kant's lifetime. The first of the two chapters devoted to the Pedagogy, by Werner Stark, provides a rigorous examination of the philological issues affecting this text, which, in spite of its problematic origin, has been published in the Academy edition as an authentic work of Kant. Stark rightly emphasizes the difference separating the Pedagogy from the lecture notes. In fact, he finally challenges the assumption that the Pedagogy published by Rink is to be regarded as an outline for a course, because this "goes against everything we know about what Kant did in other lectures" (p. 260). Stark suggests, instead, that the Pedagogy should be as a philosopher's counter-proposal to the pedagogical approach of the traditional Latin school, like the one that Kant himself had attended. Unfortunately, Stark's proposal is merely stated at the end of his chapter, and would certainly deserve to be worked out with regard to the specific ideas argued for in the Pedagogy. Susan Meld Shell sketches a more traditional picture of that problematic work, going through the main sections of the text. She also considers the broad context of Kant's views, and maintains that the similarities linking the Pedagogy with Johann Bernhard Basedow's Methodenbuch are rather superficial. Instead, Shell gives a decidedly Rousseauian reading of the text.

Anthropology and physical geography are examined in two chapters each. Of the anthropology lectures, which encompass a characteristically broad range of topics, two comparatively specific themes are considered here. Paul Guyer examines two aspects of Kant's treatment of empirical psychology that provide the ground for the theory of aesthetic pleasure in the third Critique. Guyer shows how both the individual pleasure deriving from the free play of our cognitive powers, and the social aspect of aesthetic experience, consisting in the assessment of the universal shareability of the pleasure we take in beauty, are discussed in the anthropology lectures. In Guyer's view, one main reason for the philosophical importance of the lectures is that "they help make concrete what is often so abstract in Kant's main published works" (p. 241). From a different perspective, Alix Cohen discusses a topic closer to the realm of moral philosophy: Kant's view on the feeling of the love of honour. Like many recent writers on the subject, Cohen stresses how the lectures on anthropology display great care in taking account of the most impure and messy features of the life of embodied subjects. On Cohen's reading, love of honour provides an example of how Kant's anthropology even embraces that messiness, seeing in it crucial means for both individual and collective moral development. In this light the anthropology lectures are read in full continuity with the published Anthropology as a counterpart to pure moral philosophy.

While the much discussed status of anthropology is left in the background in this volume, the chapters devoted to the lectures on physical geography consider much more closely the features of Kant's understanding of that peculiar discipline. Robert B. Louden points out what he takes to be the most compelling reasons to carefully consider Kant's treatment of geography as fully belonging to his general intellectual project. Louden goes so far as to maintain that "Kant's geography informs his philosophy from the start" (p. 510). The most significant reason, however, is probably the pragmatic importance that Kant has attributed to this discipline. In this light, geography would be an essential part of an enlightened education about the world we live in, which at the same serves as a propaedeutic to science. While Louden's perspective very helpfully summarises the distinctive features of Kant's idea of physical geography, it does not clarify whether this idea underwent significant changes during the forty years of Kant's teaching activity. A different take on the physical geography lectures is proposed by Clewis, who instead adopts a more genetic approach and focuses on the impact that the development of the critical philosophy could have had on Kant's views about physical geography, with special regard to Kant's conception of organisms and nature's agency.

At the end Clewis observes that "Kant's pedagogical theory distinguished between his technically philosophical courses (in which he introduced discriminations from the Critical philosophy) and a pragmatic, worldly curriculum that included the course on physical geography and anthropology" (p. 549). While the remark sounds like an appropriate conclusion to his chapter and even to the volume as a whole, it cannot be regarded as uncontroversial. Is the claim that geography and philosophy are characterised by different aims and different methods or perspectives an outcome or an assumption of the investigation? The supposed distinction between "technically philosophical courses" and "a pragmatic, worldly curriculum" is in fact touched upon, or presupposed, in various chapters, but never really discussed. Should the "worldly curriculum" include only anthropology and physical geography? Other essays seem to suggest that "philosophical doctrine of religion", maybe pedagogy, and even philosophical encyclopaedia, also belong in it. The reader may well find that the relationship between systematic philosophy and pragmatic disciplines, which is pointed out as crucially important, is ultimately less clear than it should be. A better understanding of the spirit of Kant's teaching activity would certainly need a much closer discussion of that general issue, which runs through many of the chapters, but always remains rather in the background.

One of the merits of the volume is, finally, to embrace the entire scope of Kant's teaching activity, thus also covering the field of natural science. Antonio Moretto provides a general survey of the only remaining version of Kant's lectures on mathematics, consisting of a set of notes by Herder. While Moretto perhaps stresses too much the uncertainty regarding the exact date of the course (probably 1762/63, at most one year later), he does not adequately consider the possibility that Herder might have followed a mathematics class by a different teacher, as Christian Onof rightly observes (cf. p. 462). In general, the caveats presented in Naragon's chapter apply here too.

Onof's and Henny Blomme's chapters deal with the physics lectures. While Onof follows the main lines of the development of Kant's view of physics through the mature critical phase of his thought, Blomme draws on the last students' notes on physics to clarify why Kant in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science considers chemistry a lesser science. In fact, the two chapters are connected as a central focus is represented by Kant's view on matter, which Onof examines as one crucially developing element in Kant's path to his mature conception, while Blomme argues that Kant's dismissal of chemistry as a proper science ultimately hinges on his reduction of the actions of matter on matter to motion. The general need of contextualization is probably even more urgent for the scientific teaching, and both chapters provide helpful insights into the state of the scientific discussions of Kant's times, clarifying how Kant related to them.

A minor reservation concerning the volume's overall structure is that the 22 chapters could have been distributed more conveniently. Whereas four chapters are devoted to the metaphysics lectures, only one really discusses the topics of the numerous and highly important notes on logic. Analogously, the 60-page lecture on pedagogy is examined in two chapters (although one is mainly concerned with philological issues), as much as the three volumes of lectures on moral philosophy and the numerous lectures on anthropology. Still, these limits are justified by what must have been the main purpose of the collection: to reclaim the general philosophical significance of these texts and to highlight the entire breadth of the areas touched by Kant's teaching activity.

In conclusion, the collection provides a helpful summary of much relevant information concerning Kant's lectures along with examinations of specific themes that give good examples of how to fruitfully approach those texts as important clues to a deeper understanding of Kant's thought. In this light, this volume represents a comprehensive plea for the great interpretive and philosophical significance of the lecture notes of Kant's students, which, to borrow Bernard Williams's phrase, can "make the familiar strange again".

[1] See Alix Cohen (ed.), Kant's Lectures on Anthropology: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2014; Lara Denis, Oliver Sensen (eds.), Kant's Lectures on Ethics: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2015. A volume on the metaphysics lectures is forthcoming in the same series.

[2] See I. Kant, Vorlesung zur Moralphilosophie, ed. by Werner Stark, Berlin, De Gruyter, 2004; Heinrich P. Delfosse, Norbert Hinske, Gianluca Sadun Bordoni (eds.), Stellenindex und Konkordanz zum Naturrecht Feyerabend, Frommann-Holzboog, 2010-2014 (2 vols.). A revised edition of the second set of Mrongovius notes on moral philosophy is also forthcoming.

[3] The English translations of the textbooks commented on by Kant in the Bloomsbury series "Kant's Sources in Translation" will contribute to a deeper appraisal of Kant's dialogue with his authors. The translations of A.G. Baumgarten's Metaphysica, G.F. Meier's Auszug aus der Vernunftlehre and J.A. Eberhard's Vorbereitung zur natürlichen Theologie have been published so far. (The latter volume has been reviewed in NDPR.

[4] See Joachim Hruschka's chapter in Denis and Sensen's Critical Guide to the ethics lectures.

[5] See J. H. Zammito, Kant, Herder, and the Birth of Anthropology, University of Chicago Press, 2002, esp. pp. 286-292. In fact, a large portion of the chapter included in Clewis's collection consists of passages taken from Zammito's earlier book: compare, for instance, Clewis 2015, pp. 312-315 with Zammito 2002, pp. 287-292; Clewis 2015, pp.316 ff. with Zammito 2002, p. 262; Clewis 2015, p. 317 with Zammito 2002, p. 276; Clewis 2015, pp. 309-312 with Zammito 2002, pp. 247-249.

[6] See A. G. Baumgarten, Philosophische Brieffe von Aletheophilus, Frankfurt and Leipzig 1741, p. 6, and Sciagraphia encyclopaediae philosophicae, Halle 1769.