Reading McDowell on Mind and World

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Smith, Nicholas S., (ed), Reading McDowell on Mind and World, Routledge, 2002, 312pp, $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 041521213

Reviewed by A. C. Genova, University of Kansas


Reading McDowell is one thing; understanding his sometimes cryptic prose is quite another. Perhaps the most fascinating, if not entirely surprising, feature of Reading McDowell is that the papers in this collection are of consistently very high quality, critical of some integral component of McDowell’s thought, and are philosophically persuasive, and yet, McDowell, in his rejoinders, argues that each, in some significant respect, has misread his recent work.

This suggests that there are some relevant distinctions applicable to Mind and World that are not entirely transparent and are easy to miss. Indeed, this is precisely the focus of McDowell’s succinct responses, where he manifests a striking philosophical virtuosity in taking on all comers. In this reviewer’s judgment, aside from the value of the anthology itself, this added bonus is the most rewarding benefit of this superb volume edited by Nicholas Smith. It consists of thirteen essays by distinguished philosophers from across the philosophical spectrum, plus the illuminating responses from McDowell. Smith divides the collection into four basic parts: Philosophy After Kant (Richard Bernstein, Michael Friedman, Robert Pippen); Epistemology (Barry Stroud, Robert Brandom, Charles Taylor); Philosophy of Mind (Gregory McCulloch, Crispin Wright, Hilary Putnam); and Toward Ethics (Charles Larmore, Rüdiger Bubner, J. M. Bernstein, Axel Honneth)—followed by McDowell’s responses.

Smith also provides a very brief Introduction in which he states the upshot of each of the contributions, but gives no assessments and takes no account of McDowell’s rejoinders. This is consistent with his goal “to enable readers to reach an informed, balanced judgment on the nature and extent of McDowell’s achievement.” On the other hand, what are those often missed, crucial distinctions alluded to above? It would help to have two things before us: first, albeit risking initiation into the ranks of the purported misreaders, a clear statement of the message of Mind and World; and second, following White’s lead (and borrowing in part from his summary), a brief account of the highlights of the collection.


McDowell’s argument is deceptively simple. In pre-Galilean thought, the Medieval philosophers enchanted the natural world with “spooky” ingredients of meaning and telic determination. With the advent of the new science and the epistemological turn to a theory of representational perception beginning with Descartes, a certain picture of experience emerged. We now had the perceiving subject on one side and the disenchanted world on the other, and experience was now construed as both an externally caused effect on our sensibility and an occurrence having epistemological relevance for empirical belief. But how can this be? It appears that there is an incommensurability between the normative space of reasons (spontaneity) and the scientific domain of blind causal relations (nature). How can experience be a passive receptivity while also having rational relations to belief? But for McDowell, this is a wrong picture productive of a pseudo-problem; he wants to exorcise the picture and dissolve the pseudo-problem.

The philosophical response to this pseudo-problem yielded two successive, misguided dilemmas. The first is reflected in the oscillation between coherentism and the Myth of the Given. The former acknowledges an irreducible dichotomy between the rational relations of spontaneity and the causal relations of nature (no justification, only exculpation) and opts for what McDowell characterizes as a frictionless system of normative relations among beliefs (only beliefs justify beliefs), thereby avoiding the problem but at the cost of no objective, external constraints—a disconnect between mind and world. The latter construes experience as a foundational given that it has a non-conceptualized content in virtue of which it can somehow warrant empirical belief, thereby again avoiding the puzzle, but now, for McDowell, we have a desideratum that cannot be satisfied. This situation can (and has) given rise to a second dilemma as embodied in the competing options of “bald naturalism” and “rampant Platonism”. The former either dispenses with spontaneity talk entirely (eliminativism) or pursues a reduction/redescription of such folklore talk in terms of purely scientific discourse, a hopeless project. The latter posits an ontologically transcendent, sui generis space of reasons separable from nature, but at the unacceptable price of supernaturalism. We are in a muddle.

The mental block is due to a false picture shared by all of the above—the confused scientistic notion that nothing natural (including sensibility) can be shaped by sui generis conceptual capacities because nature is exhausted by the realm of law. But this is a dogmatic superstition. Relying on Kantian insights, McDowell construes experience as an inextricable combination of passive receptivity and spontaneity wherein external states of affairs can be directly presented. Experience is already conceptually informed; spontaneity extends all the way out to the world—it is unbounded. Experience has conceptual content as a natural phenomenon. Thus, we recapture the correct picture via a modest re-enchantment of nature—a naturalized Platonism. The problem for McDowell is not an epistemological one, but rather, a transcendental one, viz., how is empirical content possible? Once we have been “reminded” of the correct picture, the objective purport of experience becomes transparent and unmysterious because, as he says, the conscious spontaneity we freely express can also be operative in passive receptivity where objective reality is directly present, and this is secured by the actualization of our natural conceptual capacities in sensibility. Direct Realist? Naturalized Platonist? Post-modern Aristotelian? Linguistic Idealist? Wittgensteinian Quietist? Perhaps. But certainly, as he acknowledges, a transcendental empiricist.

So we have naturalized spontaneity. But how is this possible? It is here that McDowell issues a “reminder” to the effect that there is nothing new or unfamiliar in this conception. It is a perfectly obvious presupposition of our daily practice and evolutionary history. Indeed, it was recognized by Aristotle in his account of the natural attunement of humans to the normativity of virtue—our habitually engendered “second nature”. The point is that human virtue is a specific response to reasons that naturally develops via maturation and socially structured training/practice. Similarly, responsiveness to reasons in general is a function of Bildung— our background culture and education which is not only compatible with our natural capacities, but is itself natural. But none of what McDowell says is to be construed as a philosophical theory of mental content. His project is purely diagnostic, therapeutic, non-revisionary, and non-constructive, directed to the exorcism of a wrong picture; and his appeal to the notions of an unbounded space of reasons, second nature, Bildung, and a preconceptual, holistic, socially shared background in which humans are essentially engaged with the world, etc., integrates McDowell’s message with comparable themes by so-called “continental” thinkers like Hegel, Heidegger, Gadamer, Adorno, Habermas, and others.


R. Bernstein, in his illuminating “ McDowell’s Domesticated Hegelianism” assimilates McDowell’s views to the Hegelian tradition and relates this to the pragmatism of C. S. Peirce. He argues that McDowell has not sufficiently shown how to rethink the disenchanted picture of nature (as presumably Hegel had done). Michael Friedman’s “Exorcizing the Philosophical Tradition” presents a different interpretation of the relevance of past philosophy to McDowell’s concerns, questions whether McDowell’s position constitutes a significant advance beyond Davidson, and suggests that McDowell’s making the objectivity of experience depend on the application of concepts by the perceiver leads straight to traditional idealism. But for Robert Pippin, McDowell isn’t idealist enough. In his “Leaving Nature Behind” he contends that the appeal to “second nature” needs an ontological foundation (along Hegelian lines), not just a “reminder”.

Barry Stroud, in his “Sense-experience and the Grounding of Thought”, provides a compelling analysis of perceptual experience and focuses on the adequacy of McDowell’s account of justified belief. In “Non-inferential Knowledge, Perceptual Experience, and Secondary Qualities: Placing McDowell’s Empiricism”, Robert Brandom is primarily concerned with observational knowledge. He invokes the legendary chicken-sexers to distinguish stimulus-initiated, non-inferential knowledge from immediate awareness of secondary qualities, and places McDowell’s notion of experience in an intermediate locus. This yields reservations about the explanatory work of McDowell’s notion along with several penetrating questions. In “Foundationalism and the Inner-Outer Distinction”, Charles Taylor, similar to Pippin and R. Bernstein, argues that McDowell loses sight of the holistic, ontological background in which conceptualized thought is embodied, as developed famously by Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and others.

Craig McCulloch’s interesting contribution, “Phenomenological Externalism”, challenges McDowell’s resolution of the traditional empiricist problem concerning the impact of a purely causal world on mind and argues for the centrality of a phenomenological notion of intentionality. He eschews McDowell’s emphasis on justification, because the possibility of mental content concerns intentionality and is essentially a phenomenological matter. Crispin Wright, the only participant with two contributions, his “Human Nature” and “Postscript,” provides the most formidable challenge to McDowell in the collection. According to Wright: McDowell’s conceptualized experience is counter-intuitive to our intuitions about infants and animals; McDowell must accept an extended coherentism in order to motivate the next step (invocation of second nature) in his argument—otherwise idealism; McDowell has a “quasi-inferential” conception of non-inferential justification and has not accommodated theoretical beliefs about unobservables; the appeal to second nature to reconcile normativity with nature doesn’t help. Hilary Putnam, in “McDowell’s Mind and McDowell’s World”, provides a valuable review of contemporary functionalist views that aspire to achieve an alternative approach not considered by McDowell. Although Putnam is no longer a functionalist, he faults McDowell for not addressing whether a contemporary functionalism that reduces spontaneity to the language of the “special sciences” is not a viable third option between bald naturalism and McDowell’s re-enchanted naturalism.

“Attending to Reasons” shifts the focus to ethics and moral realism, and Charles Lamore argues that McDowell needs to develop an ontology of reasons. After all, how can spontaneity or reasons have a locus in space and time? Invoking Bildung is insufficient to explain this and actually stands in the way of an adequate solution. And then we have the paradox of McDowell’s Wittgensteinian “quietist” methodology: “for how, we must ask, can showing up the mistaken assumptions underlying some philosophical problem amount to anything other than putting better views in their place?” Rüdiger Bubner contributes an instructive account of the historical career of the concept of Bildung in the German tradition, and brings a hermeneutic orientation to the problem of rationality in nature. He devotes his attention primarily to McDowell’s claim that spontaneity must be sui generis and yet be unified with the world, and relates McDowell’s project to the hermeneutic perspective of Gadamer and the continental notion of situatedness in the world (Dasein). But the main point of his “Bildung and Second Nature” is his contention that McDowell’s view of second nature is too narrow in contrast to the modern conception of Bildung because the latter also applies to human personality and reflective individuality, not just epistemic justification and a socially shared uniformity. J. M. Bernstein’s “Re-enchanting Nature” correlates McDowell’s thought with Adorno’s, i.e., Adorno’s claim that the possibility of knowledge presupposes the displacement of disenchanted nature and the cultural domination of modern science. But Adorno’s wider project has the advantage because genuine re-enchantment requires a transformation of society/politics, not just the individualized, narrowly intellectual move advocated by McDowell. Axel Honneth closes the collection with his “Between Hermeneutics and Hegelianism: John McDowell and the Challenge of Moral Realism”. He contends that although McDowell acknowledges our socialized, perceptual access to moral factors, his Aristotelian conception of virtue does not suffice for the context of moral conflict or where pre-reflective certainties are suspended—situations that demand governing moral principles that mediate conflict and doubt.


What follows, in an unrelated but seriatim order, are the more prominent distinctions (reminders?) McDowell offers: He tells us that his central concern is not that of reconciling nature as a realm of law with an unbounded space of reasons, but to dissolve the prejudice of assuming that the realm of law exhausts the concept of nature, in which case there then is no difficulty concerning how spontaneity can be sui generis while also being natural (Response to R.Goldstein, 269). Elsewhere, he says that it is not that passively perceived impressions become experiences of the objective world by being taken as such by our cognitive faculty, but that actualizations of conceptual capacities in receptivity already can reveal the objective world—not turned into objective experience via some cognitive action of being so taken (Response to Friedman, 272-273). Further, it is not that the individualized perceiver’s grasp of reality is an alternative to Hegelian talk of wide ranging social bases for normativity, but there is a reciprocity and interdependence of these two dimensions. Answerability to the world and answerability to each other stand or fall together (Response to Pippin, 275). Also, it is not that Sellars has no place for non-judgmental justifiers, but that his “sense impressions” fail on this count, not his notion of experience which closely approximates McDowell’s (Response to Brandom, 279). We learn that the picture to be exorcized is not an inside/outside picture wherein the epistemological problem concerns how knowledge of the outside realm is possible if it requires, impossibly, that events of the boundary conform to laws of causality while also manifesting allegiance to rational norms, but rather the unintelligible picture of a supposedly externally caused unconceptualized experience imposing objective constraints on the space of reasons, where the problem is one concerning the possibility of empirical content in general (Response to Taylor, 281-282).

Again, it is not that a person who perceives, say, that it is raining, thereby believes/judges so, but as McDowell states, “Certainly, one will not say that one sees that p unless one accepts that p. But one can see that p without being willing to say one does”—e.g., one may have not trusted one’s vision in the original setting but nevertheless come to recognize that one did see that p (Response to Stroud, 277). It is this sense of “seeing [or perceiving] that something is the case” that is the correct one for McDowell. Further, the problem of traditional empiricism is not that it construes the world’s impact on mind in merely causal terms, leaving no room for warrant, but that it desires experience to provide rational basis for belief and falls into the Myth of the Given which precludes satisfaction of the desideratum. That is the hitch (Response to McCulloch, 284). Moreover, it is not that there is a gap or further step required between experience and the objectively given, but rather, that experience reveals or embodies facts as such (Response to Wright, 289). Further, it is not that subsuming mental occurrences in a functionalist way under the non-strict laws of the special sciences would contrast relevantly with physicalist reductions under strict laws—in neither case would we have a sui generis space of reasons—and hence, this is not a “third option” but only a species of bald naturalism (Response to Putnam, 292-293). And it is not that an efficient cause cannot be a justification (as Davidson has shown, reasons can be efficient causes that warrant actions), but that non-conceptual input cannot justify anything— it is the non-conceptual character, not the efficient causality, that is the rub (293).

He also reminds us that it not that the seductive picture to be dislodged is a false theory to be replaced by a true one, but that the unwanted picture results from non-rational influences (superstition? confusion?), not a theory at all, and reminding ourselves of what is obvious and already in place is not promoting a revisionary view, but a remedy for a philosophical affliction (Response to Lamore, 204); and it is decidedly not that the reasons made known to us by our second nature are queer spatial-temporal entities that have causal effects on sensibility, but that “reasons can be causes” means that someone’s having a reason can be causally relevant for belief and action (205). Further, it is not that McDowell no longer accepts Dummett’s thesis that philosophy of language is foundational for philosophy, but that McDowell also accepts the Gadamerian insight regarding the role of language as a repository of tradition (Response to Bubner, 296-297). Next, it is not that bald naturalism is the opposite pole to coherentism—that is the locus of the Myth of the Given. Nor is bald naturalism (the alternative to rampant Platonism) equivalent to scientism; but given the latter, then bald naturalism contends that only the conceptualization of things as natural has a shot at truth (Response to J. Bernstein, 297). Another confusion: it is not that McDowell’s notion of conceptualized experience is meant to bring all the fine-grained aspects of what is experienced into focus (problematic), but that the whole content of whatever experience we have is due to the actualization of conceptual capacities (298). Moreover, it is not that (pace Adorno) spontaneity “all the way out” excludes dependence on objects “all the way in”—on the contrary, the latter is a corollary of McDowell’s view precisely because in experience, the world exerts constraints on empirical thought (398). Finally, in response to Honneth (301-302), it is not that a neo-Aristotelian invocation of second nature implies that unreflective perception is sufficient to resolve cases of doubt or moral conflict, but that ethical reflection based on deliberation and practical reason leading to the recognition of moral principles is a natural extension of McDowell’s conception of experience as responsiveness to the space of reasons.

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To be sure, it would be quixotic to think that McDowell’s recent distinctions will garner agreement, but they should help avoid misunderstanding. But beyond the particularities recounted above, there is something else: McDowell’s message also has a metaphilosophical import. Pace Crispin Wright (who deplores what he construes as the non-analytic style of McDowell’s book [157-158]), and Rüdger Bubner (who applauds what he thinks is McDowell’s turning his back on the Analytic school [213]), the truth is that neither sentiment applies to McDowell. Mind and World does much to dispel the increasingly outdated, anachronistic “Analytic vs. Continental” dichotomy of the twentieth century and points to a new style of philosophizing that has its roots in the past and its culmination in the future, wherein the common factor is the eradication of the radical split between mind and world.