Reading Onora O'Neill

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David Archard, Monique Deveaux, Neil Manson, and Daniel Weinstock (eds.), Reading Onora O'Neill, Routledge, 2013, 250pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415675987.

Reviewed by Anna Stilz, Princeton University


This volume presents twelve essays on the work of Onora O'Neill, along with an introduction by the editors and a reply by O'Neill. Most of the pieces originated in a two-day conference, "Ethics and Politics Beyond Borders: The Work of Onora O'Neill," held at the British Academy in September 2009. The book ranges over an extraordinarily wide scope: there are two essays treating Kant's philosophy (Marcia Baron and Katrin Flikschuh); two on O'Neill's constructivism (Melissa Barry and Thomas Hill, Jr.); three on consent, personal independence, and respect for autonomy (Neil Manson, Suzanne Uniacke, and Marilyn Friedman); one on global justice (Simon Caney); one on procreative rights (David Archard); and three on trust (Annette Baier, Karen Jones, and Daniel Weinstock).

The editors have assembled an impressive cast of contributors, and the essays are all of good quality. While the scope of the volume makes it a fitting tribute to O'Neill's incredibly wide range as a philosopher, it also makes it rather challenging to capture in a short review. So I will comment only on some of the book's main themes -- Kant, constructivism, autonomy and consent, and trust. I regret that, for reasons of space, I will not be able to engage all of the individual contributions here.

Both Baron's and Flikschuh's essays are primarily works of Kant scholarship. Baron presses O'Neill to say something about the Kantian distinction between actions that merely conform to duty, and actions that are done from duty. Should contemporary Kantians accept Kant's demanding view that only acts done from the motive of duty hold moral worth? Or should they instead allow that actions whose maxims are universalizable can have moral worth even when they are done primarily from other motives, such as sympathy or self-interest? Baron favors the latter approach. In her reply, O'Neill agrees, arguing that it is best to abandon any attempt to deeply interrogate an agent's intentions in search of his action's moral worth, and connecting this point with an evolution of her views on Kantian maxims.

Flikschuh takes up the question of Kant's religious views. She attributes to O'Neill what she calls a "radically secular" reading of Kant on religion, which connects Kantian faith to practical agency. Kantian faith allows the agent to hope that his practical agency will not be thwarted by the causal order, since God will guarantee a link between the realms of nature and freedom. Flikschuh worries that this reading reduces Kant's religion to a secular belief that it is possible to promote human progress. She also claims that making human agency the object of our hopes may be incoherent, since hope conceptually requires us to place faith in forces beyond our control. Flikschuh instead offers an alternative, more transcendent reading of Kantian faith, which connects it to the idea of a noumenal realm which is the ultimate source of our practical principles, but which we cannot understand or conceive. The merits of Flikschuh's alternative reading aside, I was not wholly convinced by her argument that it is incoherent to make human agency the object of hope. I can hope (but often not expect or predict) that I will accomplish a challenging task that stretches my capacities to the limit, or that I will rise to the occasion when facing a transformative life-experience. While the outcome depends partly on me trying, I do not know whether the world, my capacities, or the actions of others will allow me to succeed. More radically, hope does seem to me an appropriate attitude when faced with highly abstract questions about whether human nature or the course of human history will favor our efforts at moral and political reform. We have no conclusive basis for predicting the limits of human nature or human progress; we can only hope that they are consistent with our ethical aims. So while Flikschuh's alternative "transcendent" reading of Kantian faith is an interpretive possibility, I doubt we are forced to adopt it over O'Neill's.

Both Barry and Hill address Kantian constructivism, which O'Neill advocates as an alternative to both objectivist moral realism and to more subjectivist accounts of practical reasoning. O'Neill argues that we can derive a constructivist account of practical reason from a proper description of the problem which reason is meant to solve. Specifically, common reason must be "followable" by others, rejecting any claims to arbitrary authority over them. It must allow agents who do not share common "starting points" -- derived from a shared tradition or metaphysical beliefs -- to coordinate and organize their thought and action together. Such principles of reason must be intelligible to each agent, given her background starting points, and the principles must also be capable of being coherently adopted by all agents together as action-guiding. O'Neill believes that several more specific moral principles can be derived from this abstract foundation, including the rejection of injury, deception, and coercion, and of concern for the welfare of others.

In an impressive paper, Barry argues that O'Neill's constructivism is too radical, and therefore unconvincing. By way of contrast with David Gauthier's constructivist approach, Barry shows that O'Neill must import further, non-constructivist assumptions about respect for free and equal rational agency into her account, assumptions which are not derivable from the bare description of the coordination problem alone. To justify conclusions different from Gauthier's, O'Neill needs a substantive normative ideal of how agents should interact, and she relies on one, though she does not fully acknowledge it. Barry believes that this shows constructivism must be "limited": it cannot go "all the way down," but must rest on a foundation of realist moral commitments about the value of rational agency. I found Barry's critique here largely convincing. In a related paper, Hill contrasts O'Neill's Kantian constructivism with the approach taken by John Rawls, and specifically examines O'Neill's complaint that Rawls's approach relies on arbitrary starting points. Hill claims that -- unlike O'Neill -- Rawls did not think it was possible to vindicate practical principles without starting from some unvindicated starting points. The debate between these two approaches to constructivism, then, turns on whether we can justify principles sufficiently robust to solve our practical problems starting from the meager and formal set of assumptions that O'Neill's Kantian constructivism adopts. Both Barry and Hill are skeptical that we can, and I am inclined to agree with them.

The essays by Manson and Uniacke both revolve around issues of informed consent in bioethics. O'Neill's work in this area has criticized standard models, which tend to see informed consent as a robust protection for individual autonomy. One problem with informed consent, well developed by Manson, is that it is seldom transparent what exactly is being consented to. Actions are always consented to under a description, and patients may not conceive of the action in the same way their doctor does. (One example Manson develops is a case where parents consented to the removal, storage, and use of their deceased babies' "tissue," without believing that "tissue" meant hearts and organs, as the surgeons understood it to mean. If the parents had understood "tissue" in the surgeons' way, they would not have consented). O'Neill takes this problem to show that consent plays a less fundamental role in bioethics than people often believe. Consent may be merely a procedural device for altering a prior framework of rights and obligations, not a fundamental ethical notion.

Uniacke presses back against this minimalist conception of consent, which largely divorces it from individual autonomy. She raises the interesting case of a patient who -- due to severe degenerative illness -- will eventually become unable to communicate. The patient wishes his doctors to respect his desire not to have artificial nutrition discontinued before his death, even once he is unable to speak or signal that desire. Similar concerns are raised by patients who wish to decline medically advised treatments for alternatives more consistent with their goals. A prostate cancer patient may decline his doctor's recommendation of hormone treatment, because of the possible side-effects on his personal and professional commitments, or a woman with endometriosis may decline a hysterectomy in favor of a less effective treatment because she wants to conceive a child. In each case, patients wish to make important life-decisions in a way that reflects their own priorities and values. Uniacke argues that doctors ought to take into account the patients' wishes here, because of the importance of having one's values and priorities reflected in fundamental decisions about the course of one's life. Patient consent, then, can sometimes engage individual autonomy in a more robust way than O'Neill recognizes. In response, O'Neill emphasizes -- and Uniacke agrees -- that doctors cannot be obliged to respect patient wishes in every context (where the patient wants a treatment that would be prohibitively expensive, or harmful, for example). The question, then, is whether respect for individual autonomy requires consideration of patient wishes in some contexts. Like Uniacke, I am inclined think it does, because of the special importance for the individual of seeing one's values reflected in fundamental decision-making about one's life.

The final three essays take up issues of trust, especially in institutions and professional organizations. O'Neill's perspective on this issue emphasizes the importance of well-placed trust; for her, issues of trustworthiness are fundamental. This leads to a corresponding emphasis on measures that might be taken to increase trustworthiness in professional contexts, such as auditing, monitoring, or supervision. Both Baier and Jones, in different ways, challenge O'Neill's primary emphasis on trustworthiness. For Baier, trust is an attitude that manifests itself in a willingness to grant another discretionary powers with a minimum of supervision or oversight. If we engage in audits or monitoring, for Baier, that shows precisely that we fail to trust. O'Neill responds to Baier -- I think successfully -- that we should be interested in placing our trust well, and not simply in attitudes of blind trust.

Jones raises the important point, however, that trustworthiness is not sufficient to account for a relationship of trust, since it is possible to mistrust even the trustworthy. Trustworthiness by itself is not enough: there must also be uptake by the would-be truster, and sometimes this fails even where the would-be trustee is competent, honest, and reliable, and has adequately signaled this. Jones thinks such failures occur because trust has an affective component. Trust displays some hallmarks of the emotions: it can be biased, it is sometimes recalcitrant to "updating," and it is vulnerable to "spillover" effects in which one incidence of distrust is generalized to similar contexts. Therefore, trust may not always be fully responsive to our judgments of trustworthiness.

Weinstock further pursues some of the challenges of generating trust in large-scale institutional contexts, like the state, the market, or health care institutions. Trust in these institutions is important because it enables them to deliver better social outcomes, and also because we can't easily find substitutes for these institutions to fulfill our vital interests. Yet Weinstock thinks that there are distinctive obstacles to developing trust in complex institutions. Institutions are collective agents organized in accordance with macro-level rules and procedures, which means their trustworthiness needs to be assessed on the basis of these mechanisms taken as a whole, not on the basis of the character of particular individuals who work within the institution. Yet humans tend to be naturally prone to arrive at conclusions about trustworthiness from our interactions with individuals, not complex organizations. We must learn to override this natural tendency if we are to cultivate well-placed trust in institutions. Unfortunately, the media often exacerbates our natural reactions, by focusing on individual scandals and character flaws at the expense of the operation of institutions as a whole.

Both Jones and Weinstock show that in thinking about trust, it is not sufficient to be concerned with trustworthiness, since there are pathologies of affect and understanding that may cause failures of alignment between trust and trustworthiness. But I don't think they have fully exhausted such misalignments. Another misalignment, I think, derives from would-be trusters' justified disbelief in the trustworthiness of other people or institutions. This often occurs in relationships with a history of oppression, conflict, or abuse, and is another reason why it can be so difficult to rebuild trust in these relationships. When someone has experienced a series of "failed" encounters with a potential trustee, it can be entirely reasonable for him to refuse to believe in that person's present trustworthiness, even where the person is now (objectively speaking) trustworthy and has taken steps to signal that fact. The truster has a range of past evidence to balance against his present signals, and it may not be justified for him to let present signals trump, especially if vital interests are at stake. He may therefore form the justified belief that the would-be trustee is untrustworthy, even though this belief is false.

This phenomenon, I think, is of great importance in relations between oppressed groups and the political and social institutions that govern them. Such oppressed groups, or their ancestors, have experienced past mistreatment by these institutions. Yet institutions can be reformed, and they often change over time to become reasonably competent, honest, and just. The establishment of trustworthiness, however, is usually not sufficient to generate a relationship of trust. Oppressed groups are often justified in refusing to "uptake" their institutions' signals of present trustworthiness. Black citizens in the US reasonably mistrust the police, for instance, because of their long history of mistreatment, even in communities where the police are now trustworthy. Indigenous peoples reasonably mistrust their governments, even when those governments have considerably reformed their approach to indigenous affairs. The overall balance of evidence makes it justified for these groups to refuse to believe in institutional trustworthiness, and this makes it very difficult to repair relations between estranged communities. While O'Neill is right, then, that a focus on objective trustworthiness as necessary for generating relationships of trust, trustworthiness is far from sufficient. Further difficulties may prevent the establishment of trusting relationships even in the presence of trustworthiness, and not all of these difficulties are pathological.

To conclude, this volume provides a wide-ranging and high quality overview of O'Neill's contributions to moral philosophy. The essays are also of considerable philosophical interest in their own right. I commend the volume to anyone with interest in O'Neill's work, or in broader issues of Kantianism, constructivism, autonomy, consent, and trust.