Reading Plato's Theaetetus

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Timothy Chappell, Reading Plato's Theaetetus, Hackett, 2005, 246pp., $16.95 (pbk), ISBN 0872207609.

Reviewed by Mi-Kyoung Lee, University of Colorado at Boulder


Timothy Chappell's Reading Plato's Theaetetus contains a new English translation of Plato's Theaetetus, plus a detailed running commentary. The format is the same as that of F. M. Cornford's 1935 edition of the Theaetetus: he translates a piece of text, which is followed by detailed commentary. This format makes it very useful as a teaching edition, for it encourages the reader to read the text in discrete manageable sections, and to think about each of those sections on its own, before moving on to the next. It also allows Chappell to strike a good balance between detailed commentary and big picture analysis, something which tends to get lost in the literature on this dialogue. This edition would be an excellent companion to an upper-level undergraduate or graduate seminar on the Theaetetus, and will also be essential reading for philosophers and classicists interested in Plato's epistemology.

McDowell's commentary was published in 1973, and since then, scholars have done much important work on the Theaetetus. Although Chappell cannot deal with all of it and focuses on Cornford, McDowell, Bostock, and Burnyeat,[1] his commentary is useful for its evaluation and assessment of the major interpretations of the Theaetetus up to 2004, when Reading Plato's Theaetetus was originally published by Academia Verlag. The commentary contains refutations of many common scholarly assumptions about the dialogue. But Chappell also offers a brilliantly original interpretation of his own: first, he sets out to give a defense of the Unitarian interpretation of the Theaetetus superior to Cornford's, whose many defects he points out along the way; and second, he argues that Plato's Theaetetus is primarily an anti-empiricist tract. It exposes the shortcomings of that theory, and hints at the advantages of a rationalist epistemology such as Plato's, waiting in the wings.

Up through the mid-20th century, Unitarianism was the dominant view of Plato's Theaetetus, and indeed, of Plato's dialogues in general. That position holds that Plato maintained the theory of Forms and other core doctrines consistently throughout the corpus. But starting in the 60's, under the influence of G.E.L. Owen and others, people began to make more of the fact that the Theory of Forms is nowhere mentioned explicitly in the Theaetetus, and argued that Plato had, by the time of the Theaetetus, given up on that theory. (Indeed, some, like McDowell, have found evidence of Plato's criticism of the theory in that dialogue.) Revisionists take the puzzles and unsolved problems in the Theaetetus as signs of Plato's integrity and honesty in presenting problems that he himself was unable to solve.

But none of the Revisionist interpretations of the Theaetetus has been able to offer a satisfyingly coherent reading of the Theaetetus, and it has become clear that refuting Cornford (the main defender of Unitarianism with respect to the Theaetetus) does not prove that Revisionism is true. The absence of the Forms in the Theaetetus may not mean that Plato rejected the theory, but may be part of an effort to show the shortcomings of a Forms-free approach to epistemology and metaphysics. Recent examples of this approach can be found in Gokhan Adalier's Materialism in Plato's Theaetetus (Duke University PhD dissertation 1999), David Sedley's The Midwife of Platonism (Oxford 2004), and now Chappell's commentary.

Chappell's most important contribution is that he has been able to work out in detail the idea that the whole of the Theaetetus is nothing other than an extended proof of the difficulties of empiricism. Chappell thinks that Plato has in mind no particular individual, but rather a set of empiricist ideas that would be attractive to ordinary folks like the character Theaetetus in the dialogue. These are roughly (i) the idea explicitly dealt with in the Protagoras part of the Theaetetus (151-186) according to which knowledge is the same as perception, (ii) the idea that when I perceive, the object of my perception is a sense-datum in my mind, (iii) 'Ideationism' (Chappell's term), according to which "when I perceive something, Socrates for example, my perception of Socrates leaves a perceptual 'echo' in my mind: an idea or mental image of Socrates: a picture in my head", and "any idea is a picture in the head, immediately and incorrigibly available to the mind", and (iv) 'Associationism', according to which "thinking about Socrates will be associating [a] mental image with other mental images, e.g. the mental image of Theaetetus" (p. 161). According to Chappell, Plato agrees that perceptions, which are like sense-data, are in themselves infallible, but this is because in perception, we have incorrigible direct acquaintance with experienced particulars, awareness of sense-data (pp. 54-5); perception has no content about which one could be right or wrong. But beyond this, perception does not give us sufficient content to explain how beliefs are about anything. As Chappell puts it,

Plato asks: What sort of association between ideas of this sort could possibly amount to our meaning anything, e.g. that 'Socrates is Theaetetus'? How, in fact, can the empiricist explain our ability to make any judgement or form any belief at all? (p. 161)

According to Chappell, Plato's basic argument is that the empiricist has no way to explain how we get semantic content out of sense-data.

It will come as a surprise to many readers that this is the implicit lesson of the Theaetetus, but Chappell tries to show that the attentive reader will come to see it by working through the details of the dialogue. With the first definition of knowledge as perception, Plato's aim is to show that this definition implies and is implied by Protagoras' homomensura doctrine, which in turn implies and is implied by the doctrine of Heraclitean flux. He argues that Plato's aim is not, however, to show that Protagoreanism and Heracliteanism are absurd -- for he thinks that Plato accepts them in the limited sphere of perception -- but simply to show that they have limited application, i.e. to the sensible world alone. As he puts it, what is plausible as an account of what can be perceived is not plausible as an account of what can be known (p. 51). He also thinks that Protagoreanism and Heracliteanism ultimately imply the rejection of ordinary object/property metaphysics, in favor of a metaphysics of 'logically private objects' (p. 67). Chappell states this without much argument or explanation, and the reader is left to guess whether he means to endorse the phenomenalist interpretation, according to which everything is simply constructed of bundles of sense-data (in which case I would have wanted some reply to Lesley Brown's criticisms of this position[2]), and whether he thinks the flux theorist (and Plato, at least as far as perceptual reality goes) is some kind of idealist.

On the self-refutation argument against Protagorean relativism (pp. 111-117), Chappell thinks that the argument is invalid: Protagorean relativism is not self-refuting but self-defeating. For nothing Protagoras can say gives us reasons to be persuaded; all his statements are like subjective reports. On the refutation of Heraclitean flux, Chappell rejects as a fallacy the idea that the problem is that there can be no stable reidentifications of the properties of things. Rather, the problem is that if everything is in flux, then meanings are in flux too (p. 140). This suggestion is put forward without much supporting argument or evidence. On my understanding of the text, Plato has Socrates say that qualities (like whiteness) and perceivings (like perceiving white) are themselves subject to change -- in particular, changing from being white to being not-white, and from perceiving white to not perceiving white, respectively. He nowhere says that the meaning of the term 'whiteness' or 'perceiving' is undergoing change; rather, it is the phenomenal offspring of each perceptual encounter that undergoes change.

Chappell's discussion of the final refutation of the definition of knowledge as perception is somewhat abbreviated; he thinks that on Plato's view, perception is infallible, but judgments made about immediate sensory awareness are not. He does not say much about 186c6, which states, as he puts it, that 'the capacity to grasp truth(s) presupposes the capacity to use the concept "is"'. Much has been written on whether the capacity to use the concept 'is' requires knowledge of the Forms, or is simply a reference to the fact that truths require statements that say something about how the world is, i.e. statements that have propositional content. He endorses the former, although without much explanation of what the claim means (pp. 146-8).

In Plato's discussion of the second definition of knowledge as true belief, his aim is, again, to show the limitations of an empiricist approach to knowledge. Chappell doesn't explain why an empiricist in particular would want to endorse the definition of knowledge as true belief. But he does address Socrates' odd digression -- namely, the five attempts to explain how false belief is possible. He does not think that Plato is himself puzzled about how false belief is possible. Rather, he presents them as puzzles for some unnamed opponent who holds views -- not specified by Plato -- which imply that false belief is not possible. So, for example, with respect to the first puzzle, Chappell writes,

The claim that "you cannot judge what you do not know" is a corollary of the Associationist claim that to think or judge about any idea, you must already have that idea. The claim that "What you do know, you cannot judge falsely about" is a corollary of the Ideationist claim that any idea is a picture in the head, immediately and incorrigibly available to the mind (p. 162).

Chappell understands the famous Wax Tablet analogy as

offering us a more explicit account of the nature of thought, and its relationship with perception. The picture now on offer says explicitly that perception relates to thought roughly as Humean "impressions" relate to Humean "ideas"… . The objects of perception, as before, are a succession of constantly-changing immediate awarenesses. The objects of thought, it is now added, are those objects of perception to which we have chosen to give a measure of stability by imprinting them on the wax tablets in our minds (p. 178).

And the problem is that if you begin with inert objects of perception and thought -- awarenesses or sense-data -- then it is not possible to think of an object and at the same time represent it incorrectly to oneself. In general, what Plato is trying to show here, according to Chappell, is that the empiricist explanation of belief is hopeless –

there is no way for the empiricist to construct contentful belief from contentless sensory awareness alone … we need something else besides sensation to explain belief. In modern terms, we need irreducible semantic properties. In Plato's terms, we need the Forms. (p. 152)

Again, the problem, for the empiricist, is 'how we get from unstructured, contentless, and non-referring collections of mental images to semantically-structured, contentful, and reference-making beliefs' (p. 181).

The third and final definition of knowledge considered in the Theaetetus is that it is true belief with an account. Socrates initially interprets this definition in light of the so-called Dream Theory, the idea that complexes or composites can be known because they can be analyzed into elements, whereas the elements or simples themselves cannot be known. Chappell understands the Dream Theory as, again, a theory that is motivated by empiricist concerns. Indeed, he finds striking parallels between the Dream Theory and the Logical Atomism of Russell and Wittgenstein. He thinks that both theories (1) take facts to be complex abstract objects which can be analysed into elements, (2) take it to be impossible to say that the elements (namely sense-data) either exist or do not exist, (3) take elements to be perceptible, and (4) are part of a project to explain the construction of the semantic from the sensory (pp. 207-8). Both theories come to grief for similar reasons. As for Plato's own views, Chappell argues that, although he does not tip his hand anywhere, he is best understood as endorsing this final definition of knowledge as true belief with an account. This is because there is plenty of evidence from other dialogues that indicates the importance, for knowledge and understanding, of having an account or explanation of the reason why. But if Plato does intend to endorse the third definition of knowledge in the Theaetetus, why then is it ultimately rejected, just like the other definitions in the dialogue? Chappell notes quite rightly that, unlike the other definitions, the definition of knowledge as true belief with an account is nowhere given a decisive refutation. Instead, it is allowed to fail simply because none of the interpretations of 'account' which they come up with gives plausible sense to the definition.

The unifying theme of the commentary is thus the idea that Plato's objective is to show that empiricist approaches to knowledge cannot explain how sense-experience alone can provide a basis for semantic structure, and in particular for the possibility of reference; it cannot explain how we get from sense-data to meaningful content. He thinks Plato has an answer to this, but it's not one that the empiricist can help himself to: "sense experience becomes contentful when it is understood and arranged according to the structures that the Forms give to sense experience" (p. 205). I find quite persuasive the thought that Plato has in mind certain empiricist models for thinking and knowing. Thus, for example, Chappell makes an interesting and compelling case for the idea that the theory of perception in the first part of the Theaetetus is a sense-data theory. However, I am less convinced that Plato's objective in the Theaetetus is to criticize this model for being unable to explain how we can get at content. Plato does not talk about meanings or semantics, or about the problem of how we are able to mean things or refer to them. Thus, although Chappell reads Socrates' Dream Theory as a forerunner of Logical Atomism, I am somewhat skeptical about whether Plato is really concerned about whether sense-experience can furnish enough content to account for meaningful beliefs and propositions. For example, on Chappell's account, the Dream Theory's simples (or elements) are sense-data and the complexes are sets of sense-data; thus if knowledge consists of true belief with an account, then an account presumably consists of an analysis of a composite of sense-data into individual sense-data units. But none of Plato's examples to support the Dream Theory suggests anything like this. Rather, his examples of the simple-complex relation include the relation between parts of a wagon and a wagon, and the relation between letters and a syllable. Plato gives us no indication that his real concern here is with empiricism, the view that what we directly perceive are sense-data and that all thoughts are constructed by association out of those sense-data. My own view is that Plato is concerned with certain reductionist patterns of explanation, and that those who deny the existence of the Forms tend to think that giving an account will consist of going through the material parts of an individual thing, instead of in terms of relations between kinds of things. In any case, given that Plato doesn't give us the 'solution' to all these problems, it would lend greater support to Chappell's thesis if he were able to offer evidence from other dialogues -- especially the Sophist -- that Plato's concern with empiricism was indeed about the problem of meaning and reference.

Finally, Reading Plato's Theaetetus contains a new translation of the dialogue, a bold project, for there are already two outstanding modern translations of the Theaetetus: McDowell's, and Levett's (revised by Burnyeat for Hackett). It would be hard to match, much less surpass, the beauty, natural flow and accuracy of Levett's translation ['LB']; in my view, it stands as a landmark achievement in the translation of a Greek philosophical text. For those who prefer a more plain and literal translation, there's McDowell's. Chappell's translation is often more fresh, lively and colloquial than McDowell's, though not more so than LB's; there are also passages where Chappell improves on the intelligibility of McDowell's translation. But there are occasional problems with Chappell's translation: interpretation-driven concerns, mistakes, unnaturalness of tone or awkwardness, or translations that are misleading or hard to understand without knowing the Greek.

Examples of interpretation-driven concerns: Chappell's paramount objective is always a clear presentation of what he thinks Plato is trying to say. This makes the translation very readable and easy to follow. But at times the translation is driven by his interpretation of the text, which leads to overtranslation, or occasionally undertranslation. Examples of overtranslation can be found at 147c7-d2 '"I dare say what you are looking for is an answer of the same sort as the definition that your namesake Socrates and I arrived at in our recent discussions." (Socrates) "What kind of definition was that?"' (Hradion, ô Sôkrates, nun ge houtô phainetai. Atar kinduneueis erôtan hoion kai autois hêmin enangchos eisêlthe dialegomenois, emoi te kai tôi sôi homônumôi toutôi Sôkratei. To poion dê, ô Theaitête; There is nothing corresponding to 'definition' in the text, and Chappell effectively precludes independent judgment about the point of the mathematical example that Theaetetus is about to give). Another example is at 156e8 'This completes the exposition of the Heracliteans' claim' (not in the text). Also at 157a4-6 'For no process is active till it comes together with a passive, nor passive till it comes together with an active' (oute gar poioun esti ti prin an tôi paschonti sunelthêi, oute paschon prin an tôi poiounti; compare LB's 'There is no passive till it meets the active, no active except in conjunction with the passive'). Again at 158a2-3 'So we are far away from the view that "what appears to each person, is to that person". On the contrary, the truth seems to be not that all appearances are true, but that all appearances are false' (kai pollou dei ta phainomena hekastôi tauta kai einai, alla pan tounantion ouden hôn phainetai einai; the words italicized, which are not in the text, suggest incorrectly that Plato is here representing Protagoras as making dogmatic pronouncements about what is true without qualification -- as opposed to what is true for one). Examples of undertranslation can be found at Tht. 153-160, where Chappell seeks to obliterate any trace of the language of objects and properties, sometimes to strange effect; see, e.g. 152d2, 153e4 'nothing is one in and of itself', which makes it sound as though Socrates is saying that nothing has the predicate 'one' all by itself (hen men auto kath hauto ouden estin; compare McDowell's 'nothing is one thing just by itself' -- e.g. red as opposed to not red). Another example is at 156e4-7 'And the thing which was co-begetter of the colour is filled with whiteness and likewise becomes, not whiteness, but a white' (to de sungennêsan to chrôma leukotêtos perieplêsthê kai egeneto ou leukotês au alla leukon, eite xulon eite lithos eite hotôioun sunebê chrêma chrôsthênai tôi toioutôi chrômati; compare LB's 'while its partner in the process of producing colour is filled with whiteness, and there comes into being not whiteness, but white, a white stick or stone or whatever it is that happens to be coloured this sort of colour').

Examples of mistakes: 152a8 anthrôpos de su te k'agô and 156e5-7 eite xulon eite lithos eite hotôioun sunebê chrêma chrôsthênai tôi toioutôi chrômati seem not to have been translated into English. (I did not check the entire translation against the Greek text.)

Examples of awkwardness or unnaturalness of tone: 149a2 'that muscular, noble Phaenarete' (compare LB's 'a good hefty midwife'). 152c8 'Was Protagoras really a two-faced philosopher [passophos]?' (compare LB's 'Was Protagoras one of those omniscient people?'). 161e4 'Why shouldn't we conclude that the homomensura thesis is one of Protagoras' titbits for the groundlings?' (dêmousthai, compare McDowell and LB's 'playing to the crowd'). 163d6 'prodigy in nature' (teras, compare McDowell's 'monstrous'). In general, LB and McDowell tend to prefer the less technical term whenever possible in order to reproduce Socrates' conversational tone and ordinary vocabulary, whereas Chappell doesn't hesitate to use the most precise philosophical term available in English, e.g. 'percept' for to aisthêton (156b: compare 'perceived thing' in McDowell and LB), if that helps to clarify what he thinks Plato is trying to say.

Examples of inconsistency or misleading translations: 160c7-8 'So my perception is true for me, for it is always part of my essence (tês gar emês ousias aei estin). Hence, just as Protagoras says, I am the judge of the things that are for me, that they are; and of the things that are not for me, that they are not' (my italics; Protagoras is not saying that the perception is part of my essence, but that it is of the being which is bound up with me, i.e. the 'active' element that is mine. Also, 'for me' in the last clause is not in the text). 161d6 'each person will be the sole judge of his judgments' (autos ta hautou hekastos monos doxasei, compare McDowell's 'each person is himself the only one who can judge the things he does judge' and LB's 'only the individual himself can judge of his own world'). 190a2 'when [the soul] has reached a definition (hotan de horisasa, 'has reached something definite'), … this is what we call its belief'. 156a3ff. kinêsis is translated as 'process' in the passage where the doctrine of flux is first introduced, but then as 'flux' and 'change' at 181c1 ff. where that doctrine is refuted.

Despite these reservations about the translation, Chappell's commentary offers an important and original reading of the Theaetetus, according to which Plato's strategy is to show systematically the difficulties that follow for empiricism, and this will make it necessary reading for any course on Plato's epistemology.

[1] F. M. Cornford, Plato's Theory of Knowledge, London: Routledge, 1935; J. McDowell, Plato's Theaetetus, Oxford: Clarendon, 1973; D. Bostock, Plato's Theaetetus, Oxford: OUP, 1988; M. F. Burnyeat, The Theaetetus of Plato (with a translation by Jane Levett), Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.

[2] L. Brown, 'Understanding the Theaetetus', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 11 (1993) 199-224.