Reading Putnam

Placeholder book cover

Maria Baghramian (ed.), Reading Putnam, Routledge, 2012, 400pp., $42.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415530071.

Reviewed by Cory Juhl, University of Texas, Austin


Some of the papers in this varied collection interpret Putnam's claims or arguments, others present new work on a topic relating to Putnam's interests, and still others interpret and argue for positive views of their own. They are all interesting and clearly written, as are Putnam's responses.

In the introduction, Maria Baghramian provides a helpful overview of the contents. There follows a chapter in which Putnam describes the trajectories of his thinking over the years. He is partly concerned to correct what he takes to be a misapprehension: that he began his career working on the philosophy of science and mathematics, then moved on to ethics, and has now returned to science. Putnam explains that he has always been interested in both morals and the non-moral sciences.

The papers are divided into three groups (aside from a final paper by Stanley Cavell). Part I is entitled "The enigma of realism". Putnam's work on 'realism' has prompted a great deal of further reflection by Putnam, his students, and many other interested readers. Richard Boyd provides a lengthy discussion of what Putnam must have meant by realism and what led him to say some of the more enigmatic things that he says. Boyd also gives a helpful overview of his own form of realism. To make a very interesting but somewhat complex story short, Boyd is optimistic that a realistic and naturalistic account can be given of how language and brain states connect, via semantic relations such as reference, to 'natural kinds' and things in the world. There are puzzling aspects of Boyd's account, at least as presented in this brief form. For example, he thinks that there are kinds, but that kinds are "artifacts of actual language use" (p. 53). While he does not think that there are kinds independent of actual language use, it appears he thinks that there are properties independent of actual language use. These properties sometimes come in "homeostatic clusters", and kinds (or kind terms -- this distinction is not uniformly tracked in Boyd's discussion) correspond to such clusters. As I read Boyd, he seems to think that while the world does not sort itself into kinds, it does sort itself into properties, objects that have them, and causal connections. He takes his view of kinds to be realist, although kinds seem mind-dependent in a nontrivial sense. I highly recommend Boyd's concise account to anyone interested in his views.

Boyd's claim that kinds are "artifacts of actual language use" connects to central theses in Michael Devitt's paper. Devitt thinks that 'realism' is a view that at its core has nothing to do with language or semantics. He takes as a central plank of realism the claim that whatever kinds exist are not mind-dependent (or language-dependent). Thus he would surely demur from Boyd's characterization of kinds as "dependent on actual language use". This 'mind/language independence' thesis is central to an apparently continuing dispute between Putnam and Devitt concerning Putnam's discussions of 'internal realism', 'scientific realism', and 'metaphysical realism'. Putnam (echoing at least Dummett, probably others) thinks that Devitt's insistence on the centrality of broadly causal (or more generally subjunctive) mind-independence is beside the point. Neither Putnam nor Dummett, Putnam claims, ever intended to assert (other than in a 'metaphorical sense') that various entities such as electrons would not have existed if there were no actual language users (or more generally that there is any subjunctive dependence between language users and the existence of various entities and kinds posited by the sciences). Nevertheless, various quotes interspersed in both the Boyd and the Devitt article (see, e.g., the quote on p. 44 of Boyd's article) make it appear that Putnam at least in some places does assert that there is a sort of 'dependence' of objects on conceptual schemes, and a point of contention becomes: precisely what sort of 'dependence' is in question?

Putnam considers the statement 'the existence and nature of the stars is independent of our minds'. He claims that an anti-realist can 'interpret' that statement so that it is "true (in the anti-realist sense)." The ensuing dialectic is inconclusive. On one hand, Putnam and Devitt seem to agree that any sentence such as the subjunctive 'Stars would not have existed had humans not used language the way they do' can be assigned the value 'false' by both realists and antirealists. But then, Putnam argues, Devitt is wrong to assert that Putnam and Dummett and other anti-realists ever asserted that stars would not have existed if humans had not used language in the way they do. In particular Putnam denies that he ever claimed anything of the sort in Reason, Truth and History. But if one asks whether Putnam ever defended a view according to which the truth of that subjunctive followed, it is difficult to get a definite answer. The sentence can always be 'assigned the value "true"', but what is the semantic content asserted, implied, or entailed by the overall view, according to Putnam? If the sentence is interpreted using an anti-realist semantics, and if that semantics together with its background metaphysics has the consequence that stars would not have existed if people had not used language the way they do, the fact that the sentence can be 'interpreted as "true"' might seem irrelevant to Devitt's main complaint. But if the background metaphysics together with the semantics has no such consequence, is the view 'antirealist' about stars?

In Russell Goodman's paper from Part II, "Some sources of Putnam's Pluralism", he notes that Putnam in various writings takes it that two incompatible theories can both be true. In his response Putnam says that he no longer thinks this, and that what "we should say" if we are faced with two incompatible theories is that we don't know which one is right "but not that both are true". This view of Putnam's is not easy to square with his statement in the prologue that "The question, 'are there really mereological sums?', is, in my view, a pseudo-question." (p. 24) Given his broad repudiation of incompatible propositions that are both true, and that we 'should not say' that there is no fact of the matter, why not say that we simply don't (and perhaps cannot) know whether there are mereological sums of various sorts, and not that it is a pseudo-question?

The exchanges among Putnam, Boyd, and Devitt remind us how confused and confusing debates concerning 'realism' remain. Very intelligent philosophers working for decades cannot agree on how to characterize 'internal', 'scientific', or 'metaphysical' realisms or anti-realisms, whether or not they are 'semantic doctrines', let alone which, if any, of these realisms is correct.

The final paper of the first section is a methodological discussion by David MacArthur about Putnam's appeals to 'common sense'. He distinguishes a 'positive characterization', a 'negative', quietist characterization, and a 'Kantian' characterization. The first sort of appeal endorses 'common sense' views in order to settle philosophical or metaphysical disputes. The second deploys common sense as a way of undermining any positive philosophical/metaphysical views. The Kantian account of common sense is one that involves a capacity for good judgment, which we can then deploy in our evaluations of various views. The dispute that MacArthur most frequently considers is that between 'direct realism' and various 'indirect' theories of perception. We will return to theories of perception when we consider the papers by McDowell and by Travis below.

In Part II, "On what there is", the first paper is a lengthy and helpful overview by Axel Mueller comparing Quine's utter rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction and Putnam's 'friendlier' approach to analyticity. According to Mueller, Quine's premises ultimately undermine empiricism altogether. One of his arguments is a version of an argument that others have made as well, that given what Quine says it is difficult to see how there could ever be any reason to revise any theory in any one way rather than another, or to revise at all, given any empirical data. But the main conclusion that Mueller argues for is that we require some non-logical notions to be invoked to distinguish some ways of revising theories as epistemically better supported on the basis of data. Mueller thinks that Putnam's views concerning analyticity agree with this sort of picture. While many will agree with much of what both Mueller and Putnam say about analyticity, some readers will not be persuaded that a notion of the sort that Mueller ends up with is a proper descendant of that notion. They might worry that a notion of a theoretical principle that it is difficult to conceive of as false, or one there is 'no need to justify in the context' is unlikely to be illuminating for understanding the difference between what are (prima facie at least) 'deeply' empirically indefeasible statements, such as stipulative definitions, mathematical statements, and logical truths on one hand, and empirically defeasible propositions such as those of theoretical physics on the other. To the extent that one takes independence from experience as fundamental to analyticity, one is going to be less attracted to a distinction that is a contextual/local distinction between broadly empirical theoretical statements. Related to this point, in Putnam's response to Parsons' paper, he says, "I now believe that Quine did fall into the error that Reichenbach rightly foresaw, the error of assimilating the epistemology of mathematics to the epistemology of theoretical physics." (p. 202, emphasis in original) Many will heartily agree that this is an error, but might simultaneously worry that the suggested surrogate for analyticity does not avoid this error by a sufficiently comfortable margin, if indeed it avoids the error at all.

Charles Parsons contributes an interesting paper that attempts to understand how Putnam interprets Quine's ontological views, and also how Putnam's views are related to Quine's. Some subtle matters are discussed pertaining to the understanding of the notion of 'logical truths', as either claims about sets or claims about possible linguistic substitution instances. Putnam's response is equally captivating, ending with a remark that "we do have to speak of 'all languages' and of truth in an arbitrary language." (p. 203)

David Albert explains that interpreting quantum mechanics may require a return to a Lorenzian picture of spacetime according to which there may be metaphysically 'privileged' spacelike hypersurfaces. This contrasts with the dominant, Einsteinian approach of treating all hypersurfaces (within some well-defined class) as on a metaphysically equal footing. Returning to a Lorenzian approach would permit 'narratability', where we "call a world narratable if the entirety of what there is to say about it can be presented as a single story, . . . as a single temporal sequence of instantaneous global physical situations." (p. 227, emphasis in original) Putnam cautions in his response that understanding "the significance of Albert's result will have to wait . . . until we arrive . . . at an interpretation of quantum mechanics that satisfies us." (p. 239)

Ruth-Anna Putnam presents a helpful overview and unification of Putnam's writing concerning the 'fact-value dichotomy' and related matters. She recounts his reasons for thinking that evaluation is inseparable from description. While she thinks that Putnam's earlier writings on the fact/value dichotomy had been "located too exclusively in philosophy of language and philosophy of science" so that "one needs to step outside these confines, away from the spectator's point of view," she also thinks that "in his recent work Putnam has taken that step." (p. 254) Putnam gratefully notes that her paper "does not simply get my principal views about values and facts right; it 'pulls them together' in a way I have not done myself up to now." (p. 257)

Part III, "Perception", includes a paper by Tyler Burge on varieties of 'externalisms' and how unclear that term has become. Ned Block's paper argues that anyone (such as, Block thinks, Wittgenstein) who accepts the coherence or possibility of an "innocuous" variety of inverted-spectrum hypotheses should also accept the possibility of a more "dangerous" type.

These papers are followed by an interesting exchange among Charles Travis, John McDowell, and Putnam concerning the relation between concepts and perceptual experience. A central axis of contention concerns the differences between the way that a cat might experience a scene (involving a peccary meandering along a path) and the way that a normal human adult might perceive things when similarly spatially situated within the scene. Travis thinks that a cat experiences the same (type of) thing as a human similarly situated. The difference on Travis' view concerns what occurs 'downstream' from the shared experience type. McDowell thinks that Travis falls prey to the Myth of the Given. McDowell famously, following Kant, thinks that rational beings engage the world perceptually in a very different way from nonrational animals. Conceptual capacities are "operative in the peccary's being visually present to Travis" (p. 344) whereas conceptual/rational capacities are not involved in the cat's experience. Travis hopes that he is misinterpreting McDowell insofar as he takes the latter's views to commit McDowell to "posit inner objects of perceptual awareness", as a consequence of his thinking that "rational relations hold only inside the conceptual". (p. 339)

McDowell explains that his commitment to the latter does not commit him to positing only inner objects of awareness. Rather, his view concerns the nature of our engagement, as rational creatures, with the ('outer') objects that we experience. McDowell thinks that Putnam has a 'blind spot' that prevents him from accepting the Kantian view of perception. Putnam's main objection to McDowell is that he distinguishes too dramatically the way that prelinguistic infants, or other nonlinguistic creatures, and normal human adults perceptually engage their environments. The view Putnam labels "Conceptualism turns out to be either bad empirical psychology or a claim about mysterious mental powers being mysteriously 'in play'." (p. 354) Presumably McDowell would accept the latter characterization after removing the occurrences of the word 'mysteriously'.

The volume reminds us of the breadth, depth and creativity of Putnam's thinking, and the large number of very fundamental contributions that he has made. Putnam's sheer enjoyment in doing philosophy consistently manifests itself in his writing. I think it will also be clear to readers that much remains unsettled about realism, perception, and all of the areas on which he has worked. Putnam has always been willing to attempt to tackle the thorniest philosophical questions, and for his many penetrating rays of illumination into these depths, we owe him thanks.