Reading Sartre

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Joseph S. Catalano, Reading Sartre, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 213pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521152273.

Reviewed by Jonathan Webber, Cardiff University


Anglophone readers of Jean-Paul Sartre's major philosophical treatises have long been indebted to the work of Joseph Catalano. His commentaries on Being and Nothingness and Critique of Dialectical Reason together provide a detailed map of the complicated terrain of Sartre's thought and have proved indispensable to students and academics alike since their first publication in 1974 and 1986 respectively. This cartographic exegesis has grounded his own careful contributions to debates in the philosophy of mind and action, well represented by his collection Good Faith and Other Essays and his monograph Thinking Matter.

His latest book, Reading Sartre, is arguably his most ambitious, drawing together into a single narrative arc not only the two major theoretical treatises on which he has published commentaries, but also the largest two of Sartre's biographical works, the hefty Saint Genet: Actor and Martyr and the gargantuan yet unfinished The Family Idiot: Gustave Flaubert 1821-1857. Although he has brought these works together before, in the final chapter of Good Faith and Other Essays, his aim here is much broader in scope and deeper in detail. The goal of this thorough study, he tells us, is to 'rethink Sartre': although he is trying to clarify the basic structures of Sartre's theory of the place of the individual in the social and material world, he admits that he will inevitably develop only a particular perspective on that theory (p. x). His tone is thus frequently tentative and exploratory and he regularly reminds his readers to take his work as an invitation to 'read more deeply' and allow Sartre's thought to help them, as it has helped him, 'to think more clearly and more honestly' (pp. ix, xii).

Catalano illustrates Sartre's thought with aspects of our social and political life, such as the state of heightened security in which the western world has been operating for the past decade, as well as more personal dimensions of our lives, such as our childhoods and relations with our own children. He may well be right that our lives can be enriched by the ability to see it in Sartrean perspective and is certainly right to imply that we ought to be more philosophical about our quotidian concerns than is usually the case. But in emphasising this import of his book, Catalano downplays the major contribution the book is set to make to academic discussions about or informed by Sartre's existentialism.

In drawing together Sartre's four largest publications, written about a decade apart and together spanning almost his entire career, and in viewing Sartre's major biographical writings as works that develop as well as apply his philosophy, Reading Sartre sets a fresh agenda for the scholarly study of Sartre's writings and for the use of his thought to inform ongoing philosophical, psychological, and political debates. Through careful analysis of the structure and central claims of Sartre's four most substantial works, two of which have so far received scant philosophical attention, and by laying bare the theoretical relations between these works, Catalano facilitates the pursuit of this new agenda just as his earlier commentaries have facilitated discussion of Sartre for nearly four decades.

Discussions of Sartre's philosophy usually focus on an individual book, or part of a book, without regard for its place within Sartre's work as a whole. The sheer scale of Sartre's output encourages this strategy, but unfortunately the wider context may often hold the key to his more difficult passages. Some scholars have turned to posthumously published notebooks to help in the exegetical task. Catalano makes occasional reference to Sartre's notebooks on ethics but does not lean heavily on them. Indeed, he describes Saint Genet as expressing Sartre's ethical views in a way Sartre preferred to the more abstract theorising he tried in his notebooks (p. 138; cf. p. 112). What is more, Catalano is explicitly critical of using Sartre's interviews for exegetical clarification: 'Sartre frequently tried to "think against himself" in interviews' and would 'tend to go along with the objections, seeing where they would lead' (p. 80). If he did not endorse every idea he explored in interviews, the same might well be true of the notebooks.

Part of the new agenda set by Reading Sartre, then, is to read Sartre's key claims in any given work within the context of his publications across his career. Catalano focuses on two of Sartre's biographies, but we could add to these his literary and journalistic publications. What is noticeable about this context, with or without these additions, moreover, is that moral psychology and existential psychoanalysis were Sartre's central concerns throughout his life. Overall, he was primarily concerned with the reasons people turn out the way they do, with the nature of character, projects, emotions, attitudes, and values, with the relations between these, and with the role of social context in their development. And he was always very interested in the role played by imagination in all of this.

To see these concerns as merely secondary to a purely philosophical interest in metaphysics and philosophy of mind, or in transcendental ontology and the phenomenology of consciousness, as some scholars of Being and Nothingness and the essays that preceded it have done, seems mistaken from this larger perspective. It seems rather that Sartre's more purely philosophical theories are best understood with reference to the existentialism he intended them to ground. Catalano's work similarly makes clear that existentialism was neither an early phase of his thought superseded by his political philosophy nor an indulgent specialist sideshow to the main task of political critique and campaign, but rather pervaded his entire social and political outlook. The methodological aspect of the new agenda therefore brings with it a substantial aspect. Reading Sartre enjoins us to read all of Sartre in the light of his accounts of moral psychology and existential psychoanalysis.

Given this emphasis on the unity and continuity of Sartre's thought as it develops through his career, it might seem strange that Catalano has chosen neither to treat the four works in their order of publication nor to spend each chapter tracing a particular concept or theme across the four works. The structure of his book rather illustrates and employs the 'progressive-regressive' method that Sartre develops across his career. It is a great strength of Catalano's book that he provides a careful explanation not only of this method, but also of its emergence in Sartre's thought after Being and Nothingness and its development towards its apotheosis in The Family Idiot. This helps the reader not only to make sense of the structures of each of the four major works, but also to make sense of the development of Sartre's methodology and hence of his philosophy.

Reading Sartre is divided into two parts. In each part, all four works under discussion are scrutinised. The order in which they are discussed in Part One is reversed in Part Two. But this order is not chronological. Rather, the chapters of Part One are concerned with The Family Idiot, then Saint Genet, then Critique of Dialectical Reason, then Being and Nothingness. The chapters of Part Two discuss these in the opposite order, followed by a further chapter on The Family Idiot and an afterword on Sartre's understanding of Flaubert's masterpiece Madame Bovary.

Catalano thus discusses the biographies in reverse chronological order, then the treatises in reverse chronological order, then the treatises in chronological order, then the biographies in chronological order. The reader might well wonder, therefore, why the book is divided into two parts rather than four. The reason is the logic of Sartre's progressive-regressive method. Part One is a regressive phase, which aims to show that Sartre's work is a continuous development of a single basic moral psychology rather than a sequence of disjointed phases. Part Two is the accompanying progressive phase that reveals the development of Sartre's methodology by reconstructing the structures of the four works.

Part One has two major stages: an analysis of the concrete thought in the biographies and an analysis of the abstract thought in the treatises. The step from concrete to its abstract framework is a theoretical regression, even though the step from Saint Genet to Critique of Dialectical Reason is not chronologically regressive. Within each stage, the works are treated in chronological regression. Whereas The Family Idiot identifies Flaubert's historical epoch as key to understanding his project, we discover, the biography of Genet makes a similar claim about his local social environment without setting this in historical context. Whereas Critique of Dialectical Reason develops an ontology of our 'practico-inert' environment, material objects having structures and meanings that are residues of the powerful among our ancestors but whose significance is dependent on our projects, Being and Nothingness argues for a thinner ontology of entities whose meanings simply reflect the agent's projects. In both treatises, existential and political problems are traced to the way the social milieu mitigates against understanding the reality of our existence, but this 'radical evil can be eliminated by the same individual and collective freedoms that introduced it into the world' (p. 68).

Part Two is primarily concerned with explicating the structure of each text. Being and Nothingness, argues Catalano, begins with the highly abstract and progresses towards concrete reality, revising its central concepts as it does so. Critique of Dialectical Reason is the first treatise to employ the progressive-regressive method. The chronologically regressive step to the first of the biographies is an important stage of the overall progressive argument of Part Two, since without prior exposition of Critique the nascent form of the progressive-regressive method in Saint Genet could not be properly identified or explained. Finally, we find a further development of the method in Sartre's last major work, The Family Idiot, where the progressive phase can include its own regressive moments, as we have just seen exemplified by Catalano's analysis of Saint Genet in the light of Critique, and the regressive phase can include progressive moments (see, e.g., pp. 176, 179).

There is much to recommend this sophisticated and insightful book to seasoned Sartre scholars as much as to newcomers to Sartre's works. The structural analyses of the texts, and of their interrelations, are woven together with a multitude of original interpretations and critiques of the substantial content of Sartre's life's work. Rather than provide further examples, however, it would seem closer to the spirit of Catalano's open and inquiring writing to indicate some questions raised by this innovative study.

One such question concerns the role of imagination in Being and Nothingness and Critique of Dialectical Reason. Neither work devotes significant attention to imagination, yet Catalano makes clear that Sartre sees imagination at work in every aspect of the lives and works of both Genet and Flaubert. For example, Sartre sees Flaubert's physical collapse in front of his brother as a crucial event in his project of rejecting his family's values without ostracising himself. 'One must see this collapse as genuine' writes Catalano; 'it is not play acting' (p. 190). Yet the neurosis behind the collapse should be understood as 'a determined preference for the imaginary over the real' (p. 183). Sartre does indeed hold that the collapse can be a chosen, goal-directed action without resulting from explicit decision. Catalano does not make clear, however, exactly how Sartre thinks this can happen or where imagination fits into the account. It may well be that the answer to this question is not to be found in the books Catalano discusses, but in a work that preceded them, The Imaginary. Much of Catalano's careful analysis therefore seems to invite augmentation with an account of the relation between the theory of situation in Being and Nothingness and the theory of imagination in The Imaginary.

Conversely, one might wonder whether there is indeed as much continuity across Sartre's career as Catalano finds there to be. The theory of freedom that Sartre propounds in Being and Nothingness, for example, notoriously includes the claim that one can reject the entire framework of projects in which one's reasons for action are grounded. One need not have a reason to do so. One can begin anew. Yet in Saint Genet, Catalano tells us, Sartre defines 'evil' as 'the action that we have no reason to perform and every reason to avoid' and considers such actions to be impossible (p. 147). Should we take this to show that Sartre had abandoned or at least modified his early view of freedom by the time he wrote this biography? Or should we understand this talk of reasons in Saint Genet as making a normative claim about what we ought and ought not do rather than a descriptive claim about the way the world appears to us? This latter interpretation would raise the question of whether such objective normativity is consistent with the ontology of Being and Nothingness.

Reflection on this issue raises a further question: within the framework of Sartre's theory of freedom, why should we expect there to be such continuity in a person's life as Sartre finds in the lives of Genet and Flaubert? Sartre understands them each as perpetually interiorising a 'wound' sustained in childhood. For Genet this was having been branded a thief by his parents, for Flaubert having been regarded as an idiot by his parents. But why should this wound remain constitutive of their projects throughout their lives rather than becoming mere history? Even without the radical claim that one can abandon all of one's projects without reason for doing so, Sartre's theory of freedom seems to allow one project to generate reasons to adopt another project and so on until the original project is simply left behind. Why should the original project remain as fundamental?

Perhaps further investigation of Sartre's writings will turn up convincing, or at least plausible, answers to these questions. But in the absence of such answers, it seems possible that these questions point to a deeper problem with Sartre's biographical analyses and with Catalano's textual analysis. For one might wonder whether these investigations have not so much uncovered as manufactured the evidence of continuity that result from them. The progressive-regressive method, that is to say, might be a lens that distorts the more distant past to more closely resemble the more recent past, for it could perhaps generate an expectation bias that shapes the evidence to present the commonality that is being sought.

It seems clear that consideration of this concern, however, like the consideration of any threads of the complex weave that Catalano discusses in Reading Sartre, should not only take this book as the point of departure but also return regularly to it as to the rest of Catalano's work for ongoing information and inspiration, just as philosophers interested in Sartre have been doing for nearly forty years.