Reading the Dao: A Thematic Inquiry

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Keping Wang, Reading the Dao: A Thematic Inquiry, Continuum, 2011, 182pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441196514.

Reviewed by Ellen Y. Zhang, Hong Kong Baptist University


The Daodejing (or Dao De Jing, hereafter, DDJ), also known as The Book of Laozi, is an ancient Chinese text about 5,000 characters long, traditionally taken as a representative Daoist classic expressing a distinctive philosophy from the Warring States Period (403-221 BCE). It is one of the most influential examples of its genre in the intellectual tradition of China, with hundreds of commentaries written over two millennia. There have been many Western studies of the text, either from a philosophical or religious point of view, over the past 100 years, offering a wide range of interpretations due to the aphoristic and polysemic nature of the text, as well as the different hermeneutical interests of contemporary readers.

Reading the Dao: A Thematic Inquiry has its own agenda. As Wang suggests in the Acknowledgement, the book is meant to be read by those who are interested in Chinese language and "the Chinese way of thinking," and as such it defines the frame of reference for non-specialists in the English-speaking world rather than Daoist scholars or Laozi scholars who are looking for a more substantial and original scholarly work. That being said, the book has a virtue of its own. It is a comprehensive overview of Laozi's Daoism for anyone unfamiliar with the DDJ and Daoism. It is clearly written, thematically formulated, and supplemented with helpful commentaries. Wang is aware of recent archeological finds of two earlier versions of the text, the Guodian version on bamboo slips and the Mawangdui version on silk, pointing out that the latter is a text stemming from the former, but further extended and enriched by incorporating ideas from other sources including, for example, the School of Military Strategists (Bingjia) and the Legalism (Fajia). At the same time, Wang explains that "a synthesis of poetry, philosophical speculation and mystical reflection" presented by the DDJ makes the text difficult to understand without relevant annotations and commentaries (Preface). As a matter of fact, the significant role of the commentary tradition applies not only to the DDJ but also to most Pre-Han classical texts in China. It is part of Chinese hermeneutics that the boundaries of a classic remain open and thus invite various interpretations. Therefore, textual interpretation always places us within the very matrices bequeathed by the tradition as texts come down to us in a format that is shaped by other texts which, in turn, influence the way we approach and interpret them. Even though Wang has not spelled out a particular commentary tradition that influences his hermeneutic of the Dao, it is clear that he appeals to specific ways of reading that would be more attractive to modern readers.

Generally speaking, Wang's thematic exegesis is more on the side of practical issues such as how to cure a corrupted government exemplified by self-glorification and self-empowerment and social chaos caused by selfish interests and excessive desires. Nevertheless, the book begins with the topic "The Essence of the Dao," in which Wang discusses the onto-cosmological dimension of the Dao and summarizes the meanings of the Dao as 1) the proto-material or substance which constitutes the universe, 2) the potential driving force that creates all things, 3) the underlying law related to the motion and development of all things, and 4) the standard or code with which to measure human conduct (p. 3). The four categories show the characteristics of the Dao both as "being-without-form" and "being-within-form." To support his argument Wang also turns to the Zhuangzi, another important text of philosophical Daoism, contending that "a sound comprehensive" understanding of Laozi's Dao "can hardly be possible without examining the writings of another notable Daoist thinker Zhuangzi" (p. 4). The claim that Zhuangzi as a follower of Laozi helps to clarify things in the DDJ obviously has not taken into consideration a long-standing argument within the field of Daoist scholarship: there is a possibility that Zhuangzi the philosopher or the text Zhuangzi was earlier than Laozi or the text DDJ. (See A. C. Graham's argument on this issue in his book Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1989, pp. 170-171). Moreover, the two texts differ considerably in thought, especially in their understanding of the "essence of the Dao." Yet the reader does not see this kind of discussion in Wang's book.

What is the relationship between the "proto-material" that constitutes the universe suggested by Laozi's Dao and Zhuangzi's "Great Void"? Wang sees the "Great Void" as the universe. If that is the case, does it follow that what constitutes the universe is also the universe itself? If the "proto-material" refers to qi, or qi-energy, then Zhuangzi's "Great Void" has to be understood as something linked to the cosmic primordial qi as well. Wang does mention physical exercises as well as practices of spiritual cultivation that are related to qi, i.e., the practice of qigong (pp. 72-74), yet it is not very clear how the Dao should be understood both as metaphysical qi and physical qi. How should we understand Laozi's Dao as a "proto-material" thing (or no-thing) that accounts for the plurality and unity of the myriad entities in the world? Wang seems to suggest that Daoism is a kind of "substance monism." Such an interpretation is quite popular among scholars in Mainland China. But one can also see the Dao in terms of conceptual correlativity that points to non-dual polarities and mutual transformations within a dynamic unity. In fact, Wang's reading also suggests this aspect of the Dao when he speaks of relationally opposed polarities such as the hard and the soft, the beautiful and the ugly, the masculine and feminine, fortune and misfortune, etc. Wang employs the term "dialectical speculation" (p. 79) to illustrate the correlative way, the yin/yang way of thinking of Daoist philosophy. Since "dialectical speculation" is such a loaded term linked with a Hegelian model of rational process, it would be better if he further explained the term to show the unique quality of Daoist dialecticism.

Traditionally, the DDJ has been viewed as a book focused on the art of ruling. Wang acknowledges this and devotes several chapters to this issue, particularly Chapters 20 to 24. In his comments on Chapter 3 of the DDJ, Wang says

[The chapter] advises the ruling class not to elevate the worthy, not to value rare treasures and not to display or show off the desirable, so that the human competitive instinct may be diminished. This is precisely because competition among people tends to stir up social confusion and chaos (p. 90).

Then he goes on to explain the Daoist notion of "taking-no-action" (wuwei) as a political ideology, claiming that "a boat" (a metaphor for the ruling class) should try to avoid the "water swirls" (a metaphor for the subjects) by not engaging in heavy-handed ruling (pp. 90-91). In order to illustrate this point, Wang offers an example of what Mao Zedong and his Red Army did back in 1935 in Yanan when the poverty-stricken farmers there were ready for revolt (p. 91). In the chapter on peace (p. 108), Wang correctly points out that for Laozi "power struggle and greed-ridden materialism" are major reasons for social disorder, and as such the DDJ offers an explicit critique of the "traits of acquisitiveness, vanity, and competitiveness found in human nature" (p. 118). It is in this sense that we say Laozi's notion of wuwei is not exactly the same thing as the "laissez-faire policy" in modern society, which intends to promote freedom (including free competition) among people.

It has been quite popular in the West in past decades to see wuwei as a way of minimizing the power of the state. For instance, David Boaz, the vice president of the Cato Institute, identifies Laozi as "the first known libertarian" (Libertarianism: Primer, Washington, D.C: Free Press, 1998, p. 8). In his commentaries, Wang also offers a similar example when he talks about former US President Ronald Reagan, who once cited the statement "governing a large country is like cooking a small fish" from the DDJ in one of his public speeches (p. 95). The libertarian reading of the Daoist notion of wuwei may be a bit far-fetched, as Daoism promotes neither political competition nor a free market based on demand. Therefore, Wang's observation is accurate when he holds that the Daoist way of governing means that social harmony or political order proceeds in accordance with its own internal rhythms (i.e., spontaneous order, ziran) without external or coercive action. That is to say, the people should not be "cooked" or "disturbed" too much by too many orders and decrees.

It should be noted that the political implications of wuwei have often been associated with Laozi. Yet wuwei as an art of governing is not an idea used exclusively by the DDJ. Other Pre-Qin literature in which the term wuwei appears includes the Shijing, Lunyu, Shenzi, and Xunzi, etc. In fact, one of the earliest scholars who studied wuwei as political philosophy was Herrlee G. Creel. In his book What is Taoism? Creel also mentions the Confucian view that the ruler should be one who "reigns but does not rule," but he also maintains that this Confucian use of the term "does not explain, nor does it even seem adequately to foreshadow, the meaning of wu-wei in Taoist literature" (Creel, What is Taoism? and Other studies in Chinese Cultural History, Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press, 1970, p. 61).

In the chapter "On the Ideal Society", Wang discusses Laozi's political idea of "a small state with few people" (xiaguo guamin), maintaining that this idea should be taken as "a spiritual refuge for those who tend to frown upon over-civilization and shun the problematic world" (p. 117). Such a reading follows a traditional line of interpretation of Chapter 80 in the DDJ, which is viewed as describing a vision of a Daoist utopia of a communal life that is remote from the trappings of civilization. According to Wang, Laozi's idealized society is one characterized by "equality, co-production, shared consumption, non-possessiveness, and non-control" (118) and "low productivity and low living standards" (p. 118). Wang does not stand alone in this kind of assessment of Laozi's ideal state, and as such Daoist philosophy has been criticized for at best advocating a return to nature romanticism and a nostalgic dream of the "good old days", and at worst of promoting an attitude of primitivism and a reactionary disposition to human progress. Wang does not directly criticize Laozi's vision of the ideal society, but by using the phrase "Laozi's idealized society" he has made it clear that Laozi's political philosophy is idealistic and "out of the range of feasibility or possibility (p. 117). I suggest, however, that this chapter would be better understood in comparison with the Confucian notion of a "civilized" society, which helps to explicate why Laozi advocates a return to a "pre-Confucian" type of government rather than calling for a "primitive" society. Hans-Georg Moller's Daodejing: A Complete Translation and Commentary (Chicago and La Salle: Open Court, 2007) makes a good argument on this issue.

As for the English translation, it is lucid and clear while following the poetic spirit of the original text, which makes the book delightful to read. Wang also intends to keep more authentic Chinese concepts such as "being-without-form" and "being-within-form", "take-action" and "take-no-action" rather than "ready-made" Western terminology. It would have been helpful if he had provided a list of Chinese characters for key Chinese terms apart from the pinyin system.