Reading Wittgenstein with Anscombe, Going On to Ethics

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Cora Diamond, Reading Wittgenstein with Anscombe, Going On to Ethics, Harvard University Press, 2019, 331pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674051683.

Reviewed by Duncan Richter, Virginia Military Institute


The title of this book is slightly unusual, which gives a clue to the nature of the book itself. It reflects quite literally what the book is about -- there are five essays on Wittgenstein, with special reference to what can be learned from Anscombe about his work, followed by two on ethics. However, it also reflects the history of Diamond's work: she studied the Tractatus with help from Anscombe's book on it early in her career, and has since gone on to do important work in ethics, of a notably Wittgensteinian, though undeniably original, kind. It is also appropriate that the title describes activity and movement. This book is not primarily an account or even a defense, although it is also that, of what Diamond has concluded. It is also a kind of manual, leading one through a reading of Wittgenstein and on into ethics. Diamond guides the reader along paths she has taken herself, and rethinks as she does so. So the book serves as a kind of invitation to think through certain problems for oneself, but to do so in the company of Wittgenstein, Anscombe, and Diamond, as well as occasional other figures along the way. It is an education.

For those already very familiar with Diamond's work, I should point out that the six essays reprinted here have been revised for this volume (there is also a seventh essay, published here for the first time). Moreover, not only has Diamond written a short introduction to the collection, but she has also written three much longer introductions, one to each part of the book. Together these add up to seventy-nine pages of new material.

The seven main essays are grouped in three parts. The first, and longest, is on Wittgenstein (especially the Tractatus), Anscombe (especially her An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus, hereafter IWT), and the activity of philosophy (especially what it is to do philosophy well). The second part focuses on Anscombe's suggestion that there are sentences, not allowed for by the Tractatus as she reads it, that can only be true. The example that Diamond focuses on is "'Someone' is not the name of someone." Anscombe takes this to be obviously true but to deny, not something false, but "only confusion and muddle (not contradiction)."[1] Against Anscombe, Diamond argues that "there is much more room in the Tractatus for miscellaneous uses of language than we might think." (p. 135) She takes James Griffin and Michael Kremer to have shown this, with their treatment of what Wittgenstein says in the Tractatus about scientific laws and mathematical equations, respectively. These function as something like guides to thinking, and so are not nonsense, without being statements that could be either true or false. (Hence they are senseless, as Wittgenstein uses that term.)

In the third part, Diamond moves into ethics, exploring similarities and differences between Anscombe's idea that there are sentences that can only be true and David Wiggins' thought that the only thing to think about the justice of slavery is that it is unjust. The book also, as Diamond points out, "has a unity that comes out in the concluding section of Essay 5: 'In reading Wittgenstein and Anscombe, we can see them thinking about thinking, and about the ways we may respond to thinking that has miscarried or gone astray.'" (p. 2) As we go from the Tractatus and questions about, say, negation, to questions in ethics about relativism and the injustice of slavery, we move from questions that might seem technical and of limited interest to questions of wide and deep importance. Diamond demonstrates how the kind of careful thinking that Wittgenstein and Anscombe tried to get people to do, and engaged in themselves, also helps us to understand questions of undeniable importance.

Diamond's tendency to point forward to territory that is going to be crossed, and later to look back at where she, and the engaged reader, have already been, enables one to return to increasingly familiar points in order to see them from a different point of view and increase one's appreciation of their significance. Sometimes the process can prompt a change of mind. The most dramatic example of this comes when Diamond quotes something she said in the first essay, then comments (with an uncharacteristic lack of charity): "That now seems to me a stupid and misleading thing to have said." (p. 116) More often she simply notes that she would now prefer to put a point in a different way. Nevertheless, it would be a mistake to think that Diamond believes everything she says in this book, or, at any rate, believes it all to be other than stupid and misleading. This reflects the fact that the book's apparent point is not solely, or perhaps even primarily, to set forth and persuade readers of the truth of various beliefs of Diamond's.

One of her aims is to draw attention to problems that seem to have been ignored. For instance, she writes that: "The most important topic in IWT" is negation.

Why can we take for granted, about any proposition, that there is exactly one proposition which is true if it is false, and false if it is true? If we don't give that question the depth of attention it deserves, there is no way to make philosophical sense of 'true' and 'false.' Yet virtually all contemporary discussions of truth proceed with no attention to that question. (p. 49)

Diamond does not offer a complete account of truth here, but she does raise questions and go some way toward answering them.

Part of what she says about truth is that, following Aristotle and Anscombe, it can be what we call the result of thinking done well. And part of the business of thinking, Diamond suggests, is to help the business of thinking go well. One part of this is dealing with situations in which thinking either has gone badly or else looks about to go badly, not in the simple sense that it might reach a false conclusion, but in the sense that it has gone, or is about to go, off the rails completely. Diamond sees a connection here between Wittgenstein's idea of providing signposts to help philosophers avoid falling into familiar errors[2] and Anscombe's response to various kinds of (alleged) nonsense, including in ethics. Of Anscombe, Diamond writes that, "Much of her philosophizing comes out of her acute sense of how thinking has gone astray. There is no one kind of response, and her greatness as a philosopher lies partly in the variety and insight and sharpness of the responses." (p. 163)

One kind of response to off-the-rails thinking (or 'thinking') that Diamond focuses on is what she calls a path-blocker. A humble example of this kind of aid to thinking would be a note to myself reminding me that 2 x 24 ≠ 46, if, say, I often multiply these numbers for some reason and frequently get 46 instead of 48 as the answer. One might think that the reminder is completely uninformative, since (the thought would go) 2 x 24 cannot be other than 48, but in this case the reminder serves a purpose and so is not sheer nonsense. A less humble example of a path-blocker can be found in the United States' Declaration of Independence. Diamond suggests that,

we should take statements like "All men are created equal" to have, as part of their meaning, something like this: There are all kinds of differences and inequalities of talents and intelligence and reasonableness and character between human beings, but none of these can be taken to indicate an inbuilt natural distinction in virtue of which some people may justly be owned by others, and may justly be treated merely as means by which others make their wills effective. (p. 288)

If one thinks otherwise then one's thinking needs to get back on track, and a reminder that we are all created equal (which is not a statement of some contingent, empirical fact) might help. Or so Diamond argues.

Given that the book, as I understand it, is not so much a defense of certain positions as it is a manual or guide to thinking like Diamond (in the past, present, and future), evaluating it is not quite like evaluating other philosophical works. Diamond points out what she takes to be mistakes of her own that are made within this very book. If there are others to be found then finding them would not really undermine what the book is trying to achieve. Diamond is doing something like demonstrating a way, or a family of ways, of dealing with difficulties, so the value of her book depends on the value of this way of approaching problems. And the approach is, in part, to go a long and circuitous way. To attack and explore from multiple angles. At one point, Diamond describes what she is doing as "wrestling with Anscombe" (p. 128). The point of this wrestling is to come to feel certain problems as problems, and then to work one's way through to clarity about them. No summarizing statement here can make any of these problems feel important, nor could it give the achievement of unearned clarity. If Diamond's kind of method works, if I can call it a method (note her praise for Anscombe's variety of kinds of response to problems), then its result is neither this or that proposition nor the demonstration of the truth of this or that thesis. It is a clearer view of what had been seen as problematic. And the means of clarification is a kind of journeying, thinking which one has to do for oneself. I can say that I think it works, but any demonstration that it does (or does not) would require trying it for oneself.

The difficulty of her favored kind of approach comes out partly in the challenging nature of the material discussed in the early part of the book, engaging not only with the very obscure Tractatus but also with Anscombe's notoriously difficult introduction to that book. But it comes out also at the end, when Diamond shows the value of careful scholarship. Bernard Williams and Wiggins have disagreed about what can be thought about the ethics of slavery, Wiggins arguing that the only thing there is to be thought about whether slavery can be just is that it cannot, and Williams thinking Wiggins is wrong. Diamond goes into historical debates about slavery, especially in the United Sates in the period around 1833, and finds that, although she is much closer to Wiggins' view than Williams', neither seems to have researched the matter with sufficient diligence:

Bernard Williams has claimed that Aristotle's defense of slavery played a secondary role in nineteenth-century defenses of slavery, in comparison with scriptural defenses . . . He got this from Finley 1980, but what there is in Finley is a dogmatic assertion which appears not to have much behind it. Finley cites Bledsoe 1856, but there is no evidence that Finley read Bledsoe with any care, that he read any other pro-slavery work, or that he had any familiarity with the development of pro-slavery thought in America. (p. 286, note 21)

The point is not to show off her homework (although I think that showing her working is very much an important part of this book) but to bring out what can be, and in this case is, discovered by means of diligent scholarship.

Most of the problems Diamond tackles, however, cannot be solved by means of historical research. Hard work here means something else: making as few assumptions as possible, approaching questions from different directions, thinking of various examples, not taking a question to have been answered prematurely, thinking carefully about context and use, and so on. This can be difficult, and it can be tedious, but it would be hard to maintain in the face of Diamond's achievements that it is a waste of time.

Although Diamond criticizes Williams and Wiggins for their inadequate historical research, she is charitable as well. Williams, for instance, is praised for some of his other work in ethics (see p. 250), and Diamond improves Wiggins' argument as much as she can in order to show that he did not need to say some of the things that might seem to weaken his position. She also states clearly what value she finds in his work:

What I think is great about Wiggins's argument is that it leads us into an examination of what we need in order to be able to think about ethical matters. What do we need, in order to be able to think, in order to be able to think well, about such an extraordinarily significant human matter as slavery? (p. 284)

Sometimes what might look like charity is at least as much a methodological matter, the intention being to get things right. Diamond is very hesitant ever to judge that someone else is simply confused, trying as much as possible to read troublesome claims as perhaps making sense in one way or another. As she points out, "if an utterance appears to be nonsensical at first, there may very well be some not-nonsensical way of taking it." (p. 90) When one thinks one knows what a person who seems to have talked nonsense wanted to say this can blind one to other possibilities. So it is necessary to explore different things they might have wanted to say and whether their words could have been intended to say those things. "Obviously here there can be no conclusive demonstration, for the person might well be able to show that the words had been intended in some other way." (p. 91)

As I have noted, Diamond seems to want not so much to convince others that her reading of Wittgenstein or Anscombe (or Frege or Wiggins or whomever) is right, although she does argue for the interpretive claims she makes, but to share what she (thinks she) has learned from them about how to think. Hence the importance not only of doing one's homework thoroughly and carefully but also of going on to other problems not covered in the assigned texts. Hence also the importance of pointing out not only other texts to study, as she often does, but also other problems to address. There is much work to be done. Diamond offers here a course of lessons on what that work might be and how one might best approach it.


I should mention that Cora Diamond supervised my doctoral dissertation (completed in 1995). I am grateful to Reshef Agam-Segal for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.

[1] G. E. M. Anscombe An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus, Harper Torchbooks, New York, 1965, p. 85.

[2] See Ludwig Wittgenstein The Big Typescript: TS 213. Edited and translated by C. G. Luckhardt and M. A. E. Aue. Oxford: Blackwell. 2005, p. 312. Quoted in Diamond, p. 196.