Readings from the Lu-Wang School of Neo-Confucianism

Placeholder book cover

Philip J. Ivanhoe, Readings from the Lu-Wang School of Neo-Confucianism, Hackett, 2009, 197pp., $14.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780872209602.

Reviewed by Justin Tiwald, San Francisco State University



Philip J. Ivanhoe’s Readings from the Lu-Wang School of Neo-Confucianism is a translation and commentary on three major works that either constituted or influenced one of the most important schools of thought in East Asia. This school’s best-known representative was the late 15th and early 16th century Chinese philosopher Wang Yangming (1472-1529), who is known for advocating for spontaneity in moral action, upholding the ambitious metaphysical thesis that all individuals are parts of a single entity or body, and defending ideas about cultivation and moral insight that were relatively friendly to Chan (Zen) Buddhist views about religious enlightenment. The other two sources included in this work are passages from the Chinese neo-Confucian philosopher Lu Xiangshan (1139-1193) and the Chan Buddhist Platform Sutra. Both Lu and the Platform Sutra had a significant influence on Wang, and both focused on similar issues in metaphysics and moral agency. As the title of the collection hints, Ivanhoe includes both Lu and Wang because they are traditionally regarded as belonging to the same school or lineage, and because they shared a number of philosophical convictions that helped to distinguish them from more mainstream neo-Confucian philosophers.

Ivanhoe’s Readings appears at an opportune moment. While Wang Yangming is relatively unknown to those less acquainted with the history of Chinese thought, he is in fact one of the most prominent and influential philosophers in East Asia, particularly in China and Japan. For centuries, the Lu-Wang school has been one of two major rivals for the position of successor to classical Confucianism, and Wang is considered a “must read” for almost any course in Chinese thought that reaches beyond the classical era (the classical era ended circa 221 BCE). In spite of this, accessible translations of Wang have been scarce, and large swaths of Lu’s works have not been translated at all. Given the recent expansion in scholarship on China’s great thinkers and the proliferation of courses on Chinese philosophy, Readings is likely to be the first point of contact that many will have to this enormously influential school of thought.

Let me start with a brief summary of the passages and works that appear in Readings. The book presents the thinkers chronologically, beginning with the influential Platform Sutra (Part One), which is then followed by readings by Lu (Part Two) and Wang (Part Three). In the two parts devoted to Lu and Wang, Ivanhoe translates some of the thinkers’ philosophical letters and (intriguingly) a number of their poems. Of Lu’s other writings, Ivanhoe includes selections from his pithy “Recorded Sayings”, his “Expository Essays” and his “Short Meditations”. Of Wang’s writings, he includes selections from A Record for Practice (otherwise known as the Chuanxilu, the work most widely associated with Wang) and complete translations of Questions on the Great Learning and Essential Instructions for Students at Longchang. Each of these three parts is preceded by a substantive and philosophical introduction. Given the difficulty of some of the philosophers’ arguments and their regular use of technical language (or “terms of art”), the introductions are indispensable.

Ivanhoe’s selections cohere around a number of distinctive issues regarding moral agency, moral cultivation, and metaphysics. On issues in moral agency, the thinkers represented in this volume generally share the view that moral action tends to be less virtuous or proper when forced (my choice of word). Forcing a moral action can be construed in a variety of ways. For one thing, a moral agent might try too hard to perform virtuous acts without fully appreciating their importance and grounds, where such appreciation provides a better (and perhaps more natural) motive to act. Call this a forcing of her volition. For another, the agent might force her moral judgment, such that she sets out to decide whether she should approve or disapprove of something rather than permit certain more spontaneous moral sensibilities to approve or disapprove on their own (to borrow an analogy from Wang, it is better to let one’s eyes determine spontaneously whether they find a color beautiful than to set out intentionally to decide whether one should find a color beautiful) (141). Worries about these two kinds of forcing (and others like them) give rise to an array of philosophical quandaries in the Platform Sutra, which, for example, leans heavily on distinctions between merely allowing oneself to have a thought and forcibly thinking it (21-23). They are most powerfully expressed in Wang’s famous claim that “knowing and acting form a unity” (zhi xing he yi), which holds that there are tight conceptual and psychological links between the conative elements of ethical knowledge and the inclinations that motivate virtuous behavior (112-14, 123-27, 140-42).

Being philosophers in the Confucian tradition, Lu and Wang both have strong views about ethical cultivation, especially self-cultivation. Their views in this area are similar in key respects, and their similarity helps make the case for grouping them together as part of a single school or lineage. Both philosophers see self-cultivation as aimed primarily at liberating capacities that are capable of issuing quick and reliable moral intuitions, a form of what Lu and Wang call “pure knowing” (liang zhi) (91, 126-30). Both also think that finding ways to undercut our selfish desires does much of the work of liberating these capacities. What distinguishes them most from rival schools of Confucianism, however, is that they both believe the kind of knowledge one gathers in the process of moral development must be relatively simple and accessible, and thus not unduly esoteric or fragmented. (A person’s knowledge is “fragmented”, I suggest, when it consists of several beliefs the implications of which for his more accessible and deeply-felt beliefs are difficult for him to appreciate.) Lu is perhaps the most systematic defender of this claim, so I will focus briefly on his argument.

Lu’s preference for knowledge that is both simple and accessible is rooted in his belief that moral agents should act from a distinctive sort of personal conviction. If this conviction is the right sort, it will have an immediate and gripping motivational power and will preempt various forms of self-interested rationalization. To rouse this sort of conviction, however, our moral conclusions cannot be at too many inferential removes from the reasons and moral impressions that motivate us, and we should be able to see and appreciate the relevant values for ourselves (as opposed to taking them as valuable on the authority of a text or another person). Fragmented and esoteric justifications for one’s moral beliefs — or even abstract and esoteric ways of conceptualizing those beliefs — fail in one or both of these respects.

Of course, some might object that we are capable of being deeply convinced and committed to views that are simply wrong or immoral. For both Lu and Wang, an adequate response to this worry requires a turn to moral metaphysics. By tapping into the proper sense of conviction, which depends in large part on eliminating or suppressing self-centered desires, we draw upon a set of reliable moral responses that we all have by nature. In Lu and Wang’s parlance, these natural responses are one’s “principle” or “original heart-mind”, the origins of which Ivanhoe traces to the Buddhist concept of Buddha nature (4-5).

One of the knottier issues in Wang’s metaphysics centers on his claim that things do not exist (in some important sense) until perceived and experienced by the heart-mind. Some scholars have read this straightforwardly as a variant of Berkeleyan or (more often) Kantian idealism. Ivanhoe, however, offers a different account that weaves together an array of observations he makes in his definitive work on Wang, Ethics in the Confucian Tradition.1 On Ivanhoe’s reading, Wang’s primary aim is not to deny the existence of material objects or things-in-themselves, but rather to draw our attention to those aspects of our experiences that make things intelligible and valuable — in neo-Confucian parlance, their underlying “patterns” or “principles” (li). In this light, the sense in which things exist only when perceived is somewhat like the response-dependent sense in which secondary qualities only exist when perceived. Ivanhoe offers crisp examples to help readers wrap their mind around the various features of this view, drawing on our intuitions about the “existence” of the phenomenon of sadness or forebodingness in a piece of music, whose intelligibility and value is found not in the music itself but rather in our reaction to the music (108-112).

Readings also includes selections from Lu that address what is perhaps the most contested issue in neo-Confucian metaphysics, concerning the widespread assumption that there must be a master-principle to explain the order and intelligibility one finds among the discrete parts of the universe (otherwise known as "Taiji“) and the more controversial claim that this master-principle can only be explained and made coherent by some still higher metaphysical principle (”Wuji"). Lu takes issue with the pursuit of a higher metaphysical principle, likening it to the otiose activity of “stacking a bed on top of one’s bed” (64).

This is but a sample of the rich array of claims and arguments developed in the selections from Lu, Wang, and the Platform Sutra. To highlight just a few more, there is the Platform Sutra’s difficult but rewarding discussion of the doctrine that enlightenment is sudden rather than gradual (19-20, 25-26); Lu’s proposal that Buddhists are essentially concerned with their private good, despite numerous claims to the contrary (51-55); Wang’s systematic attempt to dismantle to the notion that the classics are meant simply to record successful models of the proper way of life (149-58); and Wang’s remarkable thesis that perfection in moral character (i.e., sagehood) consists not in being without flaws like selfish desires, but rather in having the ability to quickly identify and undercut the influence of such flaws (119-21). Readers in search of rich and textured philosophical worldviews will not be disappointed.

Both Lu and Wang rely on the metaphysics of principle to do some heavy lifting, and both also justify their views by appealing to the Confucian canon. This may test the patience of some contemporary readers who have an aversion to high-flying metaphysics or are not inclined to defer to the Confucian classics. But the views of Lu and Wang — even on more exegetical issues — are highly insightful and philosophically imaginative, and many of their arguments are persuasive on their own merits.

It is a safe bet that Ivanhoe’s translation will have a positive and lasting impact. To be sure, I am both an abiding admirer of Wang and sympathetic to Ivanhoe’s reading of the neo-Confucians, but the reasons to believe the volume a net gain are relatively uncontroversial. As mentioned earlier, widely distributed translations of Lu and Wang are sorely in demand, and the lack of them has prevented many a teacher of Chinese philosophy from venturing much beyond the better known Classical period in Confucian thought. Given the difficulty of the subject matter, good introductions and comments are essential, and Ivanhoe brings his characteristically lucid prose to both. Ivanhoe is extremely well grounded as a translator, so that disputes will have more to do with issues of philosophical interpretation than with parsing of sentences, stretches of grammar, or unfamiliar idioms. Most importantly, however, the other available translations of Lu and Wang’s seminal works are, in numerous places, not sufficiently accessible for classroom use, at least not without heavy supplementation. A brief comparison of Readings and its leading rivals should make this clear.

Until recently, the most widely used translations of Lu and Wang have been Wing-tsit Chan’s A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy and Instructions for Practical Living and Other Neo-Confucian Writings by Wang Yang-ming.2 Chan is a true master of the neo-Confucian corpus, and a comparison of his English renditions with the classical Chinese reveals a persuasive and impressively coherent reading of the voluminous works that he has translated. These virtues nevertheless often fail to cross over to readers working primarily with his English translations. Threads of Lu and Wang’s arguments that are readily identified in classical Chinese are frequently difficult to detect in Chan’s renditions, and in some places his translations are simply impenetrable. For example, a major point of contention between Wang and his rivals concerns the best way to expand one’s knowledge of the world, such that newly acquired knowledge has the right cognitive and affective connections to one’s pre-existing knowledge and epistemic dispositions (neo-Confucians tend to think of developing new knowledge in terms of expansion rather than discrete episodes of acquisition). In numerous exegetical disputes, Wang insists that an early Confucian phrase commonly understood as “investigating things” (ge wu) refers in fact to the more inward activity of reflecting on one’s own reaction to things. Chan, however, insists on translating ge wu with the more conventional “investigating things”, which makes Wang’s frequent attempts to link ge wu to other types of inward reflection look like a string of non-sequiturs.3 Ivanhoe translates the phrase more aptly as “rectifying one’s thoughts [about things]”, which is much to the benefit of the Anglophone reader (107-08, 146-47, 168-72).

Ivanhoe also uses considerably more explanatory footnotes than Chan does. This is particularly important when reading Wang’s routine exegetical discussions. In Chan’s translation of these discussions, his practice is simply to cite the passages to which particular quotations or paraphrases refer, which often come from sources too sundry and cryptic to help those unfamiliar with any significant portion of the Confucian classics. In contrast, Ivanhoe does not just cite the relevant passages but often supplies considerably more context, frequently quoting from the passages at greater length or explaining what’s at stake in reading them in Wang’s way rather than others (for one example, compare Chan and Ivanhoe on Wang’s interpretation of the phrase "qin min" [love of the people]).4 The sum result is that for Anglophone readers of Chan’s translations, both Wang’s argument and its upshot are nearly impossible to discern without a broad foundation in the relevant texts and exegetical disputes. For those working with Ivanhoe’s translation, however, understanding Wang’s exegesis will be (unavoidably) challenging but not impossible.

While it is not usually advised to predict with confidence the future direction of any given field, it would be surprising if interest in the Lu-Wang School of neo-Confucianism did not continue to expand — and expand rapidly — in the next couple of decades. Assuming this to be the case, Ivanhoe’s volume is sure to be read closely by scholars and will likely be a staple for courses on the longer arc of Chinese thought. In light of the many outstanding virtues of both the volume and the selections it covers, this will undoubtedly be for the best.

1 Ethics in the Confucian Tradition: The Thought of Mengzi and Wang Yangming, Revised Second Edition (Cambridge: Hackett, 2002), pp. 98-99 and passim.

2 A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963); Instructions for Practical Living and Other Neo-Confucian Writings by Wang Yang-ming (New York: Columbia University Press, 1963).

3 For example, see Instructions for Practical Living, pp. 3, 55, and 104-06.

4 Ivanhoe pp. 134-36 and Chan, Instructions for Practical Living, pp. 5-6.