Real Fourdimensionalism: An Essay in the Ontology of Persistence and Mind

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Ludwig Jaskolla, Real Fourdimensionalism: An Essay in the Ontology of Persistence and Mind, Springer, 2017, 257 pp., $99.99, ISBN 9783319659268.

Reviewed by Jonathan Simon, New York University


Three-dimensionalists and four-dimensionalists disagree over whether diachronic identity -- persistence through time -- is genuine numerical identity, or instead is a relation linking numerically distinct things existing at different times. Four-dimensionalists avoid some challenges facing three-dimensionalists. However, they owe us an analysis of the relation linking numerically distinct things existing at different times. In his intriguing new book, Ludwig Jaskolla argues that the analysis of this relation is a genuine challenge for four-dimensionalists, and that panpsychism offers an answer to it.

Panpsychism is enjoying a modest renaissance at the moment. At the center of this renaissance is the argument from structure and dynamics. It gets us to panpsychism in three easy steps. Step one: physics only tells us about structure and dynamics (what things do). Step two: if physics only tells us about structure and dynamics, physics leaves something out (what things are). Step three: what physics leaves out is mental (Stoljar (2015), Chalmers (2017).

On its face, Jaskolla's book offers a variation on this argument. He begins with five and a half chapters surveying challenges to four-dimensionalism. The focal point is Jaskolla's "challenge of insufficient binding". The challenge is that four-dimensionalists only tell us about the theoretical role of the persistence relation, and this means they leave something out. This is followed by four and a half chapters developing a panpsychist theory of persistence that addresses this challenge -- i.e., an argument that what four-dimensionalists leave out of their account of the persistence relation is mental.

Given that the argument from structure and dynamics is already a known commodity, I was expecting that Jaskolla would develop fundamentally new arguments, independent of (but parallel to) the standard ones, exploiting special features of the persistence relation. In particular, I was expecting to find an argument that four-dimensionalists leave something out that does not hinge on the standard argument that physics leaves something out, and I was expecting to find an argument that what is left out is mental that does not hinge on standard arguments that what physics leaves out is mental. Here, I was surprised: Jaskolla's arguments turn out to depend on the standard ones.

In particular, his challenge of insufficient binding -- that four-dimensionalist theories of persistence leave something out -- turns out to rely on the standard argument from structure and dynamics that physics leaves something out. And Jaskolla's case for a panpsychist theory of persistence begins with an endorsement of Galen Strawson (2006)'s independent argument for panpsychism. Accordingly, Jaskolla moves from panpsychism to a theory of persistence, rather than conversely.

This makes Jaskolla's book a hard sell for those who are not already card-carrying panpsychists. But stay tuned! As I proceed through a more detailed summary of the text, I will argue that there is indeed a novel argument from four-dimensionalism to panpsychism that naturally falls out of the considerations that Jaskolla has assembled. Though he does not make this argument, it arises out of the intersection of the themes of his book, and it should be of interest to everyone who cares whether panpsychism is true.

Chapters one and two are an introduction to Jaskolla's views about the nature of persistence. Here, we learn that he will focus on four-dimensionalism rather than three-dimensionalism (p.11), and that he opposes deflationism about the contrast between four-dimensionalism and three-dimensionalism (p.16).

These chapters are fairly idiosyncratic. For example, Jaskolla announces without argument that eternalist three-dimensionalism is not a "main competing explanation for the persistence of concrete particulars" (p.11). A few pages later, he announces without argument that in the ontology of the stage theorist "there are no spatio-temporally extended wholes" (p.13). And he tells us that it is an intuitive premise of "everyday ontology" that "For any thing X it holds true that X changes essentially between the temporal location tn and the temporal location tn+1." (p.6).

For the record, eternalist three-dimensionalism is a serious contender in the literature (see Gilmore 2018). Stage theorists need not deny that there are spatio-temporally extended wholes (e.g., the fusions of stages existing at different times). And, while it is intuitive that things can change in their accidents -- the apple can change from being green to being brown -- it is not intuitive that things can survive change in their essential properties (let alone that they change them between every two moments, which is what Jaskolla actually says). In distinguishing the accidental from the essential, we distinguish between what can change and what can't.

Chapter three is a brief general overview, which begins by telling us what Jaskolla just did in the first two chapters, and goes on to tell us what he will do in the remainder. This chapter plays the role that an introduction plays in most books; it was confusing to find it in media res.

Chapter four is an overview of what Jaskolla takes to be the five most important extant arguments against four-dimensionalism, beginning with "Linguistic and Epistemic Worries" (4.1), followed by the "No Change" objection (4.2), Jarvis Thompson's "Crazy Metaphysics" objection (4.3), "Modal Concerns" (4.4) and finally "Motions in Homogenous Masses" a.k.a. Kripke's rotating discs argument (4.5). Jaskolla is unmoved by the linguistic and epistemic worries he considers in 4.1 and by the rotating discs argument he considers in 4.5. He has more respect for the other arguments. In particular (as he explains in 5.5), they each prefigure some aspect of his "challenge of insufficient binding", the subject of chapters five and six.

Chapters five and six present a challenge to four-dimensionalism of Jaskolla's concoction, which he calls "the challenge of insufficient binding". Roughly, the challenge is that four-dimensionalists owe us a theory of the intrinsic nature of the persistence relation, and none of them have so far provided one. Here, Jaskolla casts his net too wide. He sets out to show that even those, like Sider (2001), who endorse reductive analyses of the persistence relation in terms of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity, owe us a further account of what the persistence relation really is.

There are two ways to show that a reductive account leaves something out. You either question whether X reduces to Y, or you argue that more must be said about Y. Jaskolla goes the second way. He does not challenge the extensional adequacy of reductive accounts of the persistence relation. Instead, he argues that standard physical accounts of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity leave something out.

I have two complaints here. First, Jaskolla's argument that standard physical accounts of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity leave something out (pp.97-107) is very hard to follow. It features claims labeled 'definitions' that seem to be nothing of the kind (like "Definition 1*" on page 97, which reads, "Assuming Definition 1, Rstage can be modeled by purely formal relations," or "Definition 2" on the same page which reads, "In the literature, Rstage is described adequately in purely formal terms."), among other presentational infelicities.

The gist of the argument is that those who would deny that standard physical accounts of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity leave something out are structuralists, and structuralism stands refuted by considerations in the neighborhood of Newman's Argument and Putnam's Paradox. But there is a significant literature on this issue (see, e.g., Ladyman 2016, section 3.2) and Jaskolla only engages with a fraction of it. He does not consider, for example, Melia and Saatsi's (2006) defense of structuralism from arguments in the vicinity (he cites them on p.99, but does not engage with their arguments). More generally, it is hard to tell whether Jaskolla means to advance the debate here, or just to gloss the arguments of others (in particular, those of Rosenberg 2004 and Brüntrup 2011).

On to my second complaint. One of Jaskolla's aims in presenting this material is to show that there is a hole in four-dimensionalist theories of persistence that his panpsychist theory of the intrinsic nature of the persistence relation can fill. The trouble is that even if we grant that something more must be said about the intrinsic nature of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity, it doesn't follow that anything more must be said about the intrinsic nature of the persistence relation. Since we haven't challenged the extensional adequacy of reductive accounts, one might acknowledge that more must be said about the intrinsic natures of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity, but maintain that the persistence relation reduces to some pattern in the structure and dynamics of spatiotemporal continuity and physical similarity, and accordingly maintain that it is independent of what their intrinsic natures turn out to be (just as, for example, the intrinsic nature of the property of being a mousetrap is given by the function common to its realizers, irrespective of what their intrinsic natures turn out to be).

But there is hope. As Jaskolla observes, Katherine Hawley (2001) has challenged the extensional adequacy of reductive accounts of the persistence relation. She has argued that some special, non-supervenient relation or relations, whose nature we do not know, must undergird the facts about persistence (see e.g. Hawley 2001, pp. 85-86). Crucially, it is because Hawley thinks that we must reject accounts in terms of spatiotemporal continuity, physical similarity and the like, that she thinks we don't know the nature of the persistence relation. It is because no direct reductive analysis is available that the relations in question can only be identified indirectly, by their theoretical role -- namely, the role of underpinning relations of immanent causation (which in turn underpin the facts about persistence).

Jaskolla's mistake is to attempt to tar all four-dimensionalists with the same brush. He should focus his attention on those who agree with Hawley that we do not know the nature of the persistence relation, or the relation that undergirds it. As it happens, Jaskolla tells us that he is unpersuaded by Hawley's argument against reductionism, which is based on the rotating discs argument (pp. 85-87, 116). His reservations (deriving from Butterfield 2006) are reasonable, but they put him in a bind. To motivate the project of the latter half of Jaskolla's book, we probably do best just to note that folks like Hawley should be on the market for a theory of the special intrinsic nature of the persistence relation. I'm not sure what we gain by going Jaskolla's more circuitous route.

This brings us to about halfway through chapter six, where the development of the panpsychist theory of persistence begins. Here, what I expected to find was a defense of something in the vicinity of Barry Dainton and Tim Bayne's (2005) phenomenalist theory of personal persistence (according to which personal identity is a matter of phenomenal continuity, i.e., partaking in the same token stream of consciousness), and then an argument that, if that is what persistence is for persons, then that is what it is for everyone and everything.

I will return to that line of thought below. But what I actually found in the book was much harder to characterize. Jaskolla does indeed develop a phenomenalist theory of persistence (though not the same as Dainton and Bayne's). However, his strategy is to first endorse Galen Strawson's independent argument for panpsychism (7.2.1), then develop a phenomenalist theory of persistence -- one built around a theory of mental causation.

Strawson is something of a skeptic about personal survival. According to Jaskolla, Strawson "does not believe that philosophically meaningful judgments about questions concerning the survival of . . . selves or persons are possible" (p.158). So Jaskolla's project here seems to be to reconcile Strawson's views on panpsychism and the self with a more substantial theory of persistence.

Chapters eight and nine develop a theory of mental causation in terms of which Jaskolla casts his ultimate theory of persistence. The ultimate story is that "Two S-natural individuals perdure iff they fall under one strain of development: i.e., if the temporally latter S-natural individual has been brought about by the temporally prior S-natural individual by means of mental structuring causation" (p.217).

Many interesting things happen along the way to this ultimate story. Chapter seven contains a discussion of how consciousness relates to intentionality and agency, and a discussion of whether all representation includes self-representation. Chapter eight argues for the distinction between two forms of causation, structuring and productive, and also argues against the causal closure of physics. Chapter nine develops a distinction, in the spirit of Leibniz, between basic and dominant mental individuals.

There is much to say about each of these deep topics, but I'll focus on the bigger picture, that is, the ultimate story about persistence. I was surprised to see Jaskolla resting everything on an account of causal relations. Causation, after all, is just more structure and dynamics. That is why Hawley concedes that we don't know the nature of the persistence relation: all we know is that it is the relation that underpins relevant instances of immanent causal relations. Telling us that some of the relata are mental does not tell us the nature of the relation. Of course, not everyone thinks causal relations require intrinsic or categorical grounding, but Jaskolla has just spent the better part of a book arguing that we need more than structure and dynamics here.

Jaskolla suggests that the causal episodes are decisions (p.199). This looks like progress. But then we are told that the term 'decision' is being used as a "terminus technicus indicating the irreducible power of macro-individuals be causally relevance [sic] in the sense that they themselves bring about the relevant constraint for their own possible developments" (p.200). Back to the drawing board. Later, decisions are characterized as "selections" based on "qualitative evaluations" (p. 214). But I could not find a decisive answer to the question of whether Jaskolla's "decisions" are just causal events, or the occurrent phenomenal events that underpin them.

So, let's proceed by cases. If Jaskolla's analysis ultimately bottoms out with talk about irreducible powers, then it fails to tell us about the intrinsic natures that underpin those powers, and having come all this way, we seem to be back where we began. On the other hand, if John Lennon is correct that life is what happens while we make other plans, then surely it is possible to decide to go one way, yet find yourself going another. But doesn't that refute any theory claiming that it suffices for persistence that one has some experience as of deciding to proceed one way rather than the other?

This wraps up my chapter by chapter review. Jaskolla's far-reaching book is rich with intriguing suggestions, and he draws creative connections between disparate matters. For this he is to be commended. But few accommodations are made for readers who don't buy the standard arguments for panpsychism, and the book is very hard to follow.

I'll conclude with a discussion of the argument from four-dimensionalism to panpsychism that I think can be found here, even if Jaskolla doesn't make it explicit. The first part of this argument is just Hawley's argument that the persistence relation is or is undergirded by a unique, fundamental relation (other than identity), whose nature we must discover. This is already something of which those in the Russellian monist and panpsychist camps should take note. For there are various challenges to the standard arguments that physics leaves something out (e.g., defenses of structuralism: see again Ladyman 2016). But one might endorse, e.g., structuralism about spacetime, while also endorsing Hawley's arguments.

Now, the standard way panpsychists get from "physics leaves something out" to panpsychism is by appeal to theoretical parsimony. Experience is the only intrinsic nature we know, the reasoning goes, and it is parsimonious to suppose that all intrinsic natures are of the same kind, so we should suppose that all intrinsic natures are experiential.

The standard reply is that the theoretical benefit of parsimony is not enough to warrant more than a smidgeon of credence in such a bold speculation (see Stoljar 2018). But what if our aims are more modest? What if, instead of projecting from a few instances of some properties to all instances of every relation or property whatsoever, we only want to project from some instances of a single relation to all instances of that relation? And what if, moreover, we have reason to think of that relation as unique, and fundamental?

In that case, I am suggesting, we might be on slightly firmer ground. This is to say that if we can motivate both something like what Hawley says about the nature of persistence, and something like what Jaskolla says, or what Dainton and Bayne (2005) say, about the phenomenal nature of human persistence, then we have the outline of a new argument for panpsychism, one that is immune to some of the challenges to the standard argument from structure and dynamics.

The devil is in the details, of course. We need an argument that persistence is undergirded by a single, fundamental relation (Hawley, in contrast, speaks in the plural, of non-supervenient relations). And for anything like panpsychism to follow, this relation has to be widespread in nature. If the relation only relates particles, then it isn't the same as human persistence, so whatever we learn about the latter doesn't directly tell on the former. On the other hand, if the special relation only relates humans, then all we can conclude is what we already knew, viz., that humans are conscious.

I could go on. There are plenty of obstacles in the path of this argument. But that is true of every philosophical argument. All I hope to convey here is that there is much here for everyone, panpsychists and their critics alike.


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