Real Hallucinations: Psychiatric Illness, Intentionality, and the Interpersonal World

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Matthew Ratcliffe, Real Hallucinations: Psychiatric Illness, Intentionality, and the Interpersonal World, MIT Press, 2017, 290 pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780262036719.

Reviewed by Nancy Nyquist Potter, University of Louisville


How can we account for the fact that some people sense or hear voices that others do not hear, or that some people experience themselves as having thoughts yet are not thinking? How can we best understand what is entailed in the concept of a minimal self? While other writers have theorized about these subjects, Ratcliffe offers a unique and rich phenomenological approach to understanding verbal hallucinations (VH) and thought insertion (TI) that makes a brilliant and significant contribution to these conundrums.

The theoretical backbone of Ratcliffe's argument uses the concept of intentionality. Intentionality is a concept in philosophy that concerns mental states such as perceiving, hoping, imagining, regretting, and so on. Ratcliffe argues that the modal structures of intentionality are absolutely fundamental to the structure of human experience. Verbal hallucinations and TI consist of disturbances in the modal structure of intentionality. By this, he means that modalities of experience, such as believing, imagining, remembering, and perceiving are distinct from one another and that, under certain circumstances, one might experience alterations in those modalities. These alterations, or disturbances, are multifaceted and may not best be understood in terms of psychiatric diagnoses.

Yet to focus on intentionality is not to reduce all experiences to subjective and individualistic ones, because our basic developmental and ongoing experiences fundamentally and inescapably are relational and interpersonal. This is important not only for an accurate understanding of the 'minimal self' -- a critical focus of Ratcliffe's theory on the constitution of the self -- but to an understanding of the phenomenological experience of VH and TI. Ratcliffe shows that even the most minimal self must include a sense of what kind of intentional state one is in. That is, humans necessarily have a prereflective ability to discriminate between types of intentional state that is constitutive of the minimal self.

To individualize experiences of VH and TI is to fail to understand both how disturbances in modal intentional states feel and what sorts of causes there are to such disturbances. Understanding even the minimal self as relational locates it in the social and cultural world and less in classic psychiatric diagnoses, which may miss the mark. Ratcliffe is careful to keep in the forefront of readers' minds that categorical and mechanistic ways of understanding hallucinations may not capture either the important overlaps between experiences or the knowledge we can gain by understanding phenomenological experiences of typical and unusual sense experience. His work thus is a very helpful way for clinicians to slow down the task of diagnosis and avoid being too hasty in interpreting as psychopathologies (in the current prevailing senses) the hallucinatory experiences that people report.

Ratcliffe offers a promising way to understand certain puzzling, hard-to-understand experiences. Different intentional states have different characteristic content, including different temporalities (for instance, perception is in the present, while remembering is in the past.) This helps the reader to better understand what is meant by 'intentional structure.' But one may have an experience -- a kind of intentionality -- that does not fit into established categories. When we focus on alterations in experiences of presence or of hallucinations, we come to see that intentional states cannot be understood solely in terms of characteristic experiential content. For instance, 'an experience can have a content that continues to resemble that of intentional state x more so than that of intentional state y, while the sense of being in intentional state y predominates.' The conflict between the two sense experiences gives rise to a peculiar type of experience. Framing these in terms of problems in agency and ownership is unhelpful. So is an approach that explains VH or TI in terms of mistakes or failures in mapping mental states onto an external real world. For example, hallucinations are not just experiences that seem to one to exist, but are 'exactly what they seem to be: properties of entities in our environment' (36). Hallucinations are best understood as an unfamiliar kind of intentionality rather than as a problem of agency, a mistake, or a failure.

As I stated, Ratcliffe argues that intentional states presuppose a sense of reality, meaning that one grasps the distinction between what is and what is not the case. A conflict arises when (for example) one has a sense of perceiving something when one is not perceiving it. Or, in TI, one has a strange experience of having a thought content without the experience of thinking. Thought insertion thus involves a disruption of the structure of intentionality in ways that undermine 'the integrity of experience, the sense of self, and the ability to distinguish self from nonself' (51).

Ratcliffe is nuanced and sophisticated in his approach to hallucinations. Avoiding generalizing experience, he notes that AVH and TI share some experiential characteristics. For example, the question of externality versus internality is found in many AVHs and is ambiguous in TI as well. Yet, as Ratcliffe argues, those who experience both types of AVH can convey the differences. Both are 'intrinsically strange' and 'involve an unfamiliar kind of perception-like intentional state'. Some AVH are not 'auditory' in that the experiencer does not hear a voice but rather senses it and receives some 'meaningful content from elsewhere.'

The next chapters explore the social, cultural, and historical environment that gives rise to various kinds of hallucinations. Chapter Four, on VH, focuses on anxiety. Ratcliffe suggests that anxiety 'is a type of affective anticipation, and affective anticipation contributes to the sense of being in one or another kind of intentional state' (71). Anxiety frequently is accompanied by a sense of estrangement from others. Ratcliffe argues that anxiety is constitutive of a sense of alienation from one's own thought contents and that this suggests a causal relationship. What he means by this is that VH involves a particular kind of anticipatory structure. What becomes problematic, in anticipation, is an anxious and hypervigilant concern about one's thought content. VH is a breakdown of predictive processes; it is not a failure of prediction but an indeterminate anxiety of anticipatory thought content that becomes increasingly specific due to uncertainty, self-doubt, and rising anxiety.

Chapter Five makes clear why intentional structures are inextricably bound up with the interpersonal by bringing together concepts of habitual conviction, trust, anticipatory structures, and trauma. Habitual certainty, as Husserl calls it, is a style of anticipation; it provides for and reinforces basic trust. Ratcliffe emphasizes the embodied nature of habitual positive anticipation as an experience of being immersed in a world of trust and basic security. Trust is fundamentally interpersonal -- even when we are talking about trust in government or other institutions, or self-trust -- and so when basic trust is shattered that habitual conviction is disrupted as well. Such is the case in traumatic experiences and events, wherein one experiences an enduring change in 'how one finds oneself in the world' (113). One change is that experiences of time are altered: one's forward-moving life narrative with its projects and goals is disrupted and past, present, and future are conflated.

Following Husserl, Ratcliffe argues that, when what we anticipate turns out other than expected, we are disappointed -- what Husserl calls 'negation.' Sensing what is not the case is not a matter of propositional thought but a pre-theoretic perceptual experience, and this perception, this sense, is necessary in order for one to sense the distinction between what is and is not the case as well as between imagining, reality, remembering, and so on. In other words, as Ratcliffe says, 'it is only against a nonlocalized, dynamic backdrop of confident anticipation and fulfillment that we are able to encounter a localized occurrence as anomalous' (128). Different kinds of intentional structures involve being able to grasp distinctions between different types of anticipation, different modalities.

The argument that trust plays a central role in keeping us grounded in an interpersonal and relational world and that shattered trust can give rise to experiences of VH and TI makes a wonderful contribution to understanding hallucinatory experiences. While trauma involves a loss of basic trust, it subverts trust in other people even more fundamentally. Such a loss leaves one fragile and vulnerable to anxiety and various forms of doubt. Doubt is not just an intentional anticipatory structure of belief but can implicate bodily doubt, undermining of self-confidence, disturbance in how the world appears, and so on. Anxiety, isolation, distrust, and other fearful stances toward others make it much more difficult to check one's experiences with others' experiences to see whether and how one can make sense of one's own intentional states. Furthermore, when trust breaks down, norms and conventions also are called into question. Typically, we rely on testimony, evaluations of the credibility of the communicatory, notions of evidence, and correction; when one becomes delusional, one's sense of isolation and detachment from the social world leads to such beliefs becoming inflexible; they are not anchored in a shared world and, because of anxious anticipation and deepening distrust of others, one's epistemology alternates or shifts from social and interactive to more individualist and isolated. Shattered trust evinces insecure attachments and biases in reasoning. One wants to check if one's reasoning is correct, but the progression of disturbances in anticipatory structures makes it difficult (and sometimes impossible) to correct biased reasoning.

There are a number of places where Ratcliffe does not quite say enough before he moves on. He does not fully set up the importance of anticipatory structures until Chapter Five, a placement that makes the claims in Chapter Four about the causal relationship between anxiety and VH less compelling. Also, the claim that anxiety is intrinsically alienating needs more support. The direction of Chapter Four is especially promising in its focus on anticipatory structures but not quite persuasive. Other ideas could be more fully developed as well. For example, under 'Projects and Narratives' and some other sections of the book, Ratcliffe distinguishes between two or three possibilities but provides only a brief discussion of what he wants readers to gain from noting such distinctions.

Two important concepts that Ratcliffe employs are infrequently discussed in philosophical literature: affective regulation as a phenomenological experience and the fact of embodiment. Yet he does not do enough with either of these two ideas to satisfy this reader. One wants to know more concretely how experiences of disturbances of affective regulation work in relation to intentional states, what role affective dysregulation (if that is how he thinks of it) plays in hallucinations, and whether he thinks that affective regulation would make a significant difference in reducing VH or TI. Or, are disturbances in affective regulation a causal factor in disturbances in intentional states? The idea that humans are embodied is inadequately worked into the overall argument to understand its significance to hallucinatory experiences. How does Ratcliffe want readers to understand the concept of 'embodiment' as contrasted with the concept of 'the body' or 'one's body'? Is embodiment also always already relational, and if so, how? Do alterations or slippages in the structures of intentionality necessarily implicate notions of and experiences of embodiment? This is such a crucial move and yet is left rather underdeveloped.

Despite these concerns, the book is very strong and compelling. The importance of this framework cannot be overemphasized. By drawing on a phenomenological theory of intentionality, Ratcliffe makes it possible for clinicians and other readers to understand experiences of hallucinations in a way that shifts attention away from DSM and ICD diagnostics and toward a non-pathologizing (or less pathologizing) way to help people who are distressed by hallucinations to reframe and to manage them. At the same time, it clarifies some of what has been most difficult to understand philosophically: the relationship between intentional states and the minimal self and how they map onto the social and cultural world. Ratcliffe accomplishes all this while insisting on a multifaceted and sometimes messy framework that avoids generalities and unnatural tidiness. Unquestionably, this book should provoke a conceptual and practical shift in clinicians as well as in philosophers, providing readers with welcome and positive movement in understanding human experience.