Real Likenesses

Real Likenesses

Michael Morris, Real Likenesses, Oxford University Press, 2020, 228pp., $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198861751.

Reviewed by Alberto Voltolini, University of Turin


Michael Morris’ book is very inspiring and stimulating, full of novel ideas that definitely lead one to think again on two topics, pictorial representation and fiction, whose affinities are pretheoretically evident but that are seldom exploited in view of an overall theory of them (Walton 1990 is a prominent exception). In fact, Morris’ ambition is not that of putting forward a new theory of depiction (8), but that of solving something that precedes that theory; namely, the fact that paintings, photographs, and narrations present a similar paradox that must be dealt with in a very similar way. The paradox consists in a pair of statements which, in two different formulations, seem to be contradictory. For example, as regards a portrait of a face, the Paradox of Painting consists in the fact that one may at one and the same time say the seemingly respectively contradictory sentential pairs:

(C1) (i) That’s a face; and (ii) that’s not a real face;

(C2) (i) That’s a face; and (ii) that’s worked in paint. (8)

Also in the versions concerning photographs and narrations, the extant theories of depiction and of fiction are for Morris respectively unable to satisfactorily solve the paradox, because in their attempted solutions they fail to account for what he finds to be a very plausible thesis concerning all such domains, i.e., the Non-Distraction Thesis:

(ND) Attending to the medium of a representational work cannot inevitably be a distraction from attending to its content, or vice versa. (21)

As Morris himself acknowledges (21n.8), (ND) sounds very similar to Richard Wollheim’s thesis that pictorial experience is a perceptual experience of seeing-in in which one simultaneously attends to both the medium and the content of a picture, yet in two different folds of that experience. But, adds Morris, although we are entitled to say that pictorial experience is an experience in which we see-in a picture, Wollheim’s ‘twofold thesis’ is actually a misformulation of (ND) (46). I suspect that the main worry Morris has with Wollheim’s interpretation of (ND) does not have anything to do with the problem of whether, in Wollheim’s account, attention is equally distributed across both folds or either fold merely involves perception—sometimes even Morris himself wavers between speaking of attention and speaking of mere perception in this context—but with the problem that Wollheim’s appeal to experiential folds whose natures are radically different makes it impossible to account for the fact that pictorial experience is unitary, as other people have also stressed (Hopkins 2010, Chasid 2014, Nanay 2016).

Now, considering pictorial experience as unitary is the key for Morris to solve the Paradox of Painting. First, to put things in terms that Morris does not use but suggests (in the prototypical case of sculptures, he says, “the content is made of the medium” (53)), the content of a painting that one sees-in it is inflected, i.e., it has properties that depend on some of the properties of the painting’s medium. These are the properties that contribute to making that medium, which is just a physical object among others—the medium as conceived in a Merely-Material conception, in Morris’ terms (28), into a pictorial medium, i.e., the medium as articulated in terms of the painter’s creative intentions and artistic choices—the medium as conceived in an Artist-Centred conception, still in Morris’ terms (28); let me call it the enriched medium. Hence, second, once the medium of a painting is so enriched, the content of that painting that we see-in it turns out to be a painted something, e.g., a painted face. This item is not a weird Meinongian object, but a unified whole whose parts must be interdependent (56, 61); as is later specified in the book à propos of fictional characters, it is an abstract artefact depending for its existence on the existence of its creators (146, 188). Yet, third, a painted something (a painted face) is somehow another something (a face), i.e., it is something that really resembles that second something (a face). So, the Paradox of Painting is easily solved. For the seemingly respectively contradictory sentential pairs can be reformulated as:

(C1*) That’s a painted face, though of course it’s not a real face;

(C2*) That’s a painted face, so of course it’s worked in paint.

which are not contradictory, since there is no incompatibility between the attributions that occur in them to one and the same object; namely, the painted thing co-referred to by the occurrences of “that” and by the anaphorical pronoun “it” in the above pairs: a painted face fails to be a real face and is worked in paint (53). Mutatis mutandis, for Morris a similar solution must be provided to the similar Paradox of Photographs (80) and of Fiction (143).

To begin with, I generally agree with Morris’ overall plan of amending the Wollheimian account of paintings and of extending it to photographs, but I wonder whether he really succeeds in providing such an amendment. First, even if there were a symmetric supervenience between the enriched medium and the painted object, as Morris claims (63), I wonder whether the latter is something that asymmetrically supervenes on the medium as a physical object, as Morris also claims (63). For, as ambiguous pictures show, there are many cases in which, depending on how the physical medium is properly seen, different pictorial media correspond to it (e.g., in the duck-rabbit case, one and the same physical object may be seen either duckwise or rabbitwise, so that two different painted objects (a painted duck and a painted rabbit) match those different pictorial media, even if there is just one and the same physical medium). So, what makes a medium enriched must be properly conceived otherwise. Indeed, second, since Morris acknowledges that for Wollheim seeing-in experiences arise in natural contexts where no proper pictures are involved, as when we see faces in rocks and animals in clouds (12), I wonder whether the enriched conception of the medium must make reference to artistic intentions and choices. For in those contexts, obviously such intentions and choices are missing. Third, I wonder whether it is appropriate to label what we see-in a painted something. For this label seems adequate when we are entertaining nested seeing-in, i.e., when we see pictures in pictures. It is just when one sees, in a picture, a picture of a face that one may say that one sees a painted face, rather than straightforwardly a face. Fourth and more problematically, I wonder whether a painted object may arise out of the enriched medium in the way Morris points out. In order to convince us that there are painted objects, Morris reverts to toy objects and to sculpted objects, for he says that painted objects are just other items of the same kind. But in such cases, the only thing that there is is just an arranged physical object; namely, the object that is taken to be a toy version of a real object (say, a toy soldier), or the object that is a sculptural representation of another object (say, the stone representation of a lion). This arranged physical object is what one may refer to demonstratively, or even as an extended designatum (Nunberg 1978) of a certain term that ordinarily designates the object it is a version or a representation of (as in “put the rocking chair near the lion”). Now, once pictures come to the fore, the arranged physical object is nothing but the enriched medium, not the painted object. Witness the fact that the arranged object is not a real likeness of the object of which it is a version or a representation. Simply, as Ernst Gombrich (1963) originally pointed out with his example of the hobby horse subsequently reprised by Kendall Walton (1990), the arranged object is a sort of functional replica of the latter object: a toy soldier is something that (in certain ludic contexts) one treats as a soldier, and the stone representation of a lion is something that (in certain make-believe contexts) one makes as if it were a lion.

Given the above remarks, I think that (C1) and (C2) should be instead reread as:

(C1**) That’s seen as a face, though of course it’s not a real face;

(C2**) That’s seen as a face, for it’s worked in paint.

with “that” and the anaphoric pronoun “it” as co-referring to the enriched medium in both sentential pairs. This reading shows that the enriched medium is (knowingly) mistaken for the picture’s content, which is what the painted object—a painted face, in Morris’ example—amounts to. Incidentally, insofar as what is seen as something else (e.g., a face) is the enriched vehicle knowingly mistaken for that something (a face), just as in any other case in which one mistakes an object for another object—say, a rope for a snake—one can even keep (C1) and (C2) as they are, while however distributing demonstrative reference in both as follows. In both sentential pairs constituting (C1) and (C2) respectively, the second occurrence of “that” refers to the enriched medium that is felt as present and knowingly mistaken for the picture’s content, while the first occurrence refers precisely to that content, which is not felt as present because of the felt presence of the enriched medium. (This is the reading suggested by Magritte’s famous painting that Morris also discusses (9–10), La trahision des images.) The content may rightly be taken as having the relevant property—e.g., being a face—but not because it is a real likeness, as Morris claims. For either the content has the property in a constitutive sense—it is intrinsically a face—or it has the corresponding ‘in the picture’-property—it is a face in the picture. Both the above readings of (C1) and (C2) are contemplated in my book (2015). Pace Morris (16n.7), the halo of contradiction is removed in both readings.

Moreover, the aforementioned fourth problem for Morris’ account occurs again as regards the Paradox of Fiction. Indeed, I do not manage to see how, by virtue of having the narrative medium articulated by the authorial choices, on top of it one may also have a fictional character possessing the relevant property determined by that articulation and resembling something really having that property. Here Morris appeals to the ideas that there is a non-transactional use of language in which words, instead of having an arbitrary meaning, work as verbal mimes intrinsically related with that meaning (6.3, 6.6). These ideas are interesting and plausible—Morris does not explicitly say that, but one may trace them back to the second of Wittgenstein’s claims that a sentence, just like a picture, sometimes tells itself (2009:I, §523) insofar as its words are experienced as having a meaning that amounts to a physiognomy (ib.:I, §568) of what they refer to («“I feel as if the name ‘Schubert’ fitted Schubert’s works and Schubert’s face.”» ib.:II, xi§270). Now, I share (Voltolini 2006) Morris’ belief both that there are fictional characters and that they are abstract artefacts depending for their existence on the existence of their creators, although pace Morris (184–6, 188), since they are abstracta they can hardly be perceived. Yet I am not convinced by Morris’ idea that they come into existence with the properties characterizing them by virtue of their being determined by how a narrative text is structured. Curiously enough, precisely a case that should support Morris’ point, the case of shape poems, vividly illustrates my perplexity. Consider this poem by Dylan Thomas whose figurative structure mimics a diamond-shaped body but whose words fail to have a diamond-shaped body as their fictional character. Even though being written in that particular shape definitely makes a contribution to the poetry’s meaning, the poetry generates no fictional character having that property.

Dylan Thomas Poem

We learnt from Nelson Goodman (1968) and John Kulvicki (2006) that one and the same sign may be taken either as a verbal sign or as a pictorial sign depending on the representational system to which it is taken to belong. Hence pace Morris, it is not in virtue of its forming a name of the famous British director that a certain string of letters shaped in a particular way mimics that director’s famous facial profile (Voltolini 2015:43).

Hitchcock Profile

One may perhaps put things in this way. If there is a Morrisean solution to the Paradox of Fiction, this consists in taking it not in its specificity, but as a mere particular instance of the Paradox of Painting, where words are taken as pictures of their meaning. So, pace Morris, one may see his remarks about the three paradoxes as contributing to clarifying at most, if not depiction itself, then at least our experience of it. But this move merely brings one back to the aforementioned problems of his solution of the Paradox of Painting.


Chasid, A. 2014. “Pictorial Experience: Not So Special After All”. Philosophical Studies 171, 471–491.

Gombrich, E. 1963. Meditations on a Hobby Horse. London: Phaidon.

Goodman, N. 1968. The Languages of Art. Indianapolis: Boobs-Merrill.

Hopkins, R. 2010. “Inflected Pictorial Experience: Its Treatment and Significance”. Philosophical Perspectives on Depiction, eds. C. Abell and K. Bantinaki. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 151–180.

Kulvicki, J. 2006. On Images. Oxford: Blackwell.

Nanay, B. 2016. Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Nunberg, G. 1978. The Pragmatics of Reference. Bloomington: Indiana University Linguistics Club.

Voltolini, A. 2006. How Ficta Follow Fiction. Dordrecht: Springer.

Voltolini, A. 2015. A Syncretistic Theory of Depiction. Basingstoke: Palgrave.

Walton, K. 1990. Mimesis as Make-Believe. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

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