Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, Routledge

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Lillehammer, Hallvard and Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo (eds.), Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, Routledge, 2003, 256pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415249813.

Reviewed by John Divers , University of Sheffield


This festschrift appears on the occasion of Hugh Mellor’s transition from Professor to Emeritus Professor of Philosophy at Cambridge University. The edition contains a brief academic and intellectual biography (pp.1-2) as well as a comprehensive bibliography (pp.239-45) of Mellor. The core of the book consists in a dozen substantive essays that have been contributed by Mellor’s “colleagues, mentors and students” (his own characterization, p. 212). The contributors and their topics are (in order of appearance) as follows: David Armstrong (truthmakers for modal truths), David Lewis and Gideon Rosen (truthmakers for contingent truths); Peter Smith (deflationism about truth and inflationism about facts); Chris Daly (truth and communication); Tim Crane (subjective facts) Frank Jackson (the conceptual dimension of physicalism); Paul Noordhof (mental causation and epiphenomenalism); Peter Menzies (the ontology of causation); Issac Levi (dispositions and conditionals); Alexander Bird (the essentiality of dispositional properties); Arnold Koslow (the reduction of possibilities to nomological explanations); Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (the relational theory of change) and Nathan Oaklander (presentism). In keeping with tradition, Hugh Mellor replies to the contributors, and a concise summary of the contents of the papers and of Mellor’s replies to them are given in the brief editorial introduction (pp.2-11).

By way of an incidental observation, I note that there is some evidence here of a conscious ideological positioning of Mellor and his work. The editors have given the festschrift a title that lends itself to interpretation as a provocative claim about what really counts as metaphysics. Perhaps no more than an innocent hybrid was intended (Mellor being the author of “Real Time” and “Metaphysical Matters”) but, even if so, one might imagine that Hugh Mellor would not be too disturbed by the unintended connotation. The editors (who are, of course, philosophers in the Cambridge tradition) also congratulate Mellor on remaining “faithful to the Cambridge tradition of straight thinking, clear writing and sharp argument” (p.1). The curious reader might be drawn to speculate about where faux metaphysics is practiced or about which other “traditions” have no such claims on the aforementioned philosophical virtues. But on with the main business.

The standard of papers throughout the volume is high and many are likely to become important points of reference in the subjects that they deal with. However, it is often the case with editions in this style that a distinctive kind of illumination is generated by the replies, and Mellor’s replies here present a very informative picture of his overall philosophical position and temperament. The forum of the reply is of course useful in allowing Mellor the chance to correct misconceptions about his positions and to give his own version of how his own position relates to that of the author. But in this forum we also find out what Mellor thinks is important in the papers and even - occasionally - that he has changed his position and why. I think that it is this aspect of the edition which is most usefully sketched in a review.

David Armstrong (“Truthmakers for modal truths”) and David Lewis (“Things qua Truthmakers” and its Postscript, co-written with Gideon Rosen) both attempt to advance the project of finding truthmakers for certain truths. Armstrong’s central proposal is that whatever is a truthmaker for p, where p is contingently true, will also be a truthmaker for the truth that it is possible that not-p. Lewis’s central proposal is that counterpart theory allows propositions predicating contingent features to individuals (Possum is black) to have the individuals in question (Possum) as truthmakers. Armstrong is motivated in his search by acceptance of the working hypothesis that every truth has a truthmaker. And the pivotal problem in both the Armstrong and the Lewis paper is how to find truthmakers (for the propositions that are their respective concerns) that satisfy the requirement of necessitation - necessarily if the truthmaker exists then the proposition in question is true. Mellor (pp.212-16) chooses not to engage his interlocutors much in the detail of their papers since, we find, he parts ways with them at a relatively early stage in the dialectic. Specifically, Mellor rejects both the principle that every truth has a truthmaker (pace Armstrong) and the requirement of necessitation (pace Armstrong and Lewis). But what we do learn from Mellor’s reply is how his disagreement with Armstrong on truthmaking is relatively superficial while his disagreements with Lewis are deep. Thus Mellor sides with Armstrong against Lewis in insisting upon actualism and non-mereological composition. However, the allegiances do not always fall this way.

In his reply (pp.216-17) to Peter Smith (“Deflationism: the facts”), we learn that Lewis and Smith have succeeded in persuading Mellor to reject a correspondence theory of truth - or at least to withdraw the claim that a correspondence theory is forced upon Mellor by the other things he believes about truth: that truth is a matter of the success of beliefs, and that some truths need truthmakers. This success account of truth to which Mellor subscribes also receives much needed clarification in his response (pp.217-20) to the detailed and probing objections of Chris Daly (“Truth and the theory of communication”).

Mellor also departs from Armstrong by rejecting most of the important theses of physicalism that Armstrong endorses and also much of the born-again physicalism of Frank Jackson (“From H2O to Water “). But Mellor goes along with Lewis (and Armstrong) in rejecting Jackson’s one time contention - and the present contention of Tim Crane (“Subjective facts”) - that learning what red looks like involves the existence and cognition of a subjective fact. While unpersuaded by Crane’s central argument, Mellor is again moved to useful clarification of an aspect of his own position, this time prompted by the desire to maintain consistency with his independently held view that complex truth-functional propositions stand in no need of full-blooded truthmakers.

Paul Noordhof (“Epiphenomenalism and causal asymmetry”) seeks to enlist an amended Mellorian theory of causation in strengthening and extending the case against epiphenomenalism. But Mellor (224-9) is, by and large, keener on an unamended Mellorian theory of causation, and although he is prepared to accept most of the claims made by Peter Menzies in support of the thesis that causation is a genuine relation - including some “polite corrections” of Mellor’s previous claims - he is not moved to accept the thesis itself.

Isaac Levi (“Dispositions and Conditionals”) departs from Mellor by denying that dispositional truths entail counterfactual conditionals, but the deeper and underlying disagreement is over Lev’s denial that counterfactual conditionals have truth-values. More radically yet, Levi (p.142) professes neither understanding nor interest in a distinction, fundamental to Mellor’s views on many matters, between predicates that pick out properties and those that don’t. Yet Mellor (pp.229-30) proves surprisingly flexible in his capacity to find congenial elements within Levi’s “anti-ontological” approach to dispositions. Alexander Bird (“Structural properties”) deals with the questions of whether various properties are dispositional or categorical, and of whether dispositional properties are essentially dispositional. Here, Mellor (pp.230-2) seems reluctant to accept the distinctions that Bird wants to draw, or at least he is reluctant to accept Bird’s view of the nature (ontological or not) and import of the mooted distinctions. But once he orientates the questions to his liking, Mellor endorses the claim that all properties are both categorical and dispositional and admits to being strongly tempted by the view that all lawful connections among properties are full-blooded necessitations.

Arnold Koslow (“Laws, explanations and the reduction of possibilities”) proposes a reduction of possibilities to laws and explanations. But - as I understand it - the relevant possibilities are entities, and the relevant kind of reduction is neither conceptual analysis nor the identification of each possibility with some sort of construct out of reducing entities. In any event, the kind of natural modality (possibility) which proves amenable to such reduction does not sustain the validity of the inference from Necessarily P to Possibly P. And while Mellor (pp.232-4) views this feature as a defect that stands in need of a remedy, he finds much in Koslow’s essay to illuminate tricky issues about chances since these can be counted among Koslow’s range of possibilities.

The relational theory of change has it that those properties that can change are relations to times. Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (“What is the relational theory of change?”) and Mellor (pp.234-5) are united both in rejecting the relational theory of change and in rejecting the standard objections to the relational theory of change. This unity gives way, however, on the question of exactly what is wrong with the theory. Ultimately, Rodriguez-Pereyra has it that the relational theory fails, not in the detail of this or that version, but for the quite general reason that it is - when viewed aright - eliminative rather than explanatory of the occurrence of change. Mellor resists this suggestion and maintains, against Rodriguez-Pereyra’s criticisms, that the theory has the unacceptable consequence that every thing that has a changeable property must have that property at some spacetime point.

The series of exchanges ends in perfect harmony since the respondent finds nothing in Nathan Oaklander’s essay (“Presentism: a critique) with which to disagree. Rather, Mellor takes Oaklander to have provided a “demolition of th[e] delusion” (p.236) that a presentist A-theory of time is immune from objections that do for other varieties of A-theory and subsequently uses Oaklander’s essay as a means of amplifying his (Mellor’s) long-standing complaint that Prior’s presentism fails to add an ontological basis to his A-theoretic semantics for tensed sentences.

In sum, what is on offer here is exactly what one would expect - an impressive overview of Hugh Mellor’s substantial contribution to metaphysics over his long and productive career. This overview is illuminated by a collection of philosophers who are, at the least, very accomplished and who are, for the most part, ’onside’ of Mellor’s conception of what is important in philosophy and of how philosophy should be done. It should be clear from the foregoing that this does not preclude disagreement between Mellor and his interlocutors on any number of details or on some of the most fundamental issues in metaphysics. On the other hand, none of the essays amounts to a taking of fundamental issue with Mellor on any of the tenets that are central to his philosophical identity - say, the existence of facta or the tenseless theory of time. Perhaps a festschrift is not the time or place for full scale battles of that sort, but in some ways such a bold departure would have suited Mellor’s reputation as a forthright and combative opponent in debate. But no doubt such exchanges are yet to come elsewhere. For on present evidence Mellor has lost none of his enthusiasm for his project and shows every sign of continuing to offer original contributions to metaphysics and related disciplines - contributions which are often both entirely distinctive and yet unpredictable.