Realisms Interlinked: Objects, Subjects, and Other Subjects

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Arindam Chakrabarti, Realisms Interlinked: Objects, Subjects, and Other Subjects, Bloomsbury, 2020, 341pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350044463.

Reviewed by Jay L. Garfield, Smith College/Harvard Divinity School


This is a book of staggering erudition; it is broad in vision, metaphysically ambitious, and beautifully written. Arindam Chakrabarti knows the history of Indian philosophy as well as anybody alive, and his deep familiarity with the Sanskrit literature across the many Indic traditions and schools of thought from the Vedic period to the present is unmatched. His knowledge of the history of Western philosophy and engagement with contemporary disputes in metaphysics and epistemology is also extremely impressive. This broad expertise in the history of philosophy informs the analytic work of this book beautifully.

Although this encyclopedic vision of the history of these two great philosophical traditions is deployed throughout, the book is neither a history of philosophy nor a synopsis; instead, it is a systematic exploration of the structure of metaphysical realism in close dialogue with a vast cast of appropriate interlocutors drawn from each tradition. Few readers will be familiar with all of these philosophers. Any reader -- even those steeped in the history of Indian or Western philosophy -- will be rewarded with a wealth of insights into the interrelations between realisms about different classes of entities, as well as an appreciation of the enormous value of pursuing philosophy across cultures. The scholarship sits lightly; the style is clear, breezy, and witty. This book offers the reader many opportunities to stop and to smile.

The volume is also a fine demonstration of how to pursue cross-cultural philosophy. Chakrabarti never falls into the trap of doing "comparative philosophy," of treating his interlocutors as objects of study, and the two traditions with which he engages as mere hunting grounds for similarities and differences. Nor does he presume that his readers will be familiar with all of his interlocutors. He introduces less familiar figures appropriately, contextualizing them within their schools of thought. He provides both lucid translations of relevant fragments and superb exegeses of them, explaining what we can learn from these many voices, and setting them into dialogue with one another instead of fixing them under a microscope to be compared with one another. Chakrabarti puts this methodology nicely:

Apart from conceptual clarification and progress toward alternative solutions of substantial philosophical issues, these chapters demonstrate the advantages of doing philosophy in a cosmopolitan key, drawing equally from the wealth of arguments in Sanskrit, as well as Anglo-American and European sources, without slipping into wooly difference-ignoring, "who-said-it-first" sorts of cultural comparisons. (8)

Most of all, the volume is a sustained defense of a thoroughgoing metaphysical realism, a defense conducted with one foot firmly in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition of India, and the other in the analytic tradition of Peter Strawson. The history of philosophy with which the book is packed is deployed in the service of this argument. Chakrabarti argues relentlessly that one cannot easily pick and choose among entities or classes of entities, being realist about these, but not those.

Realism about particulars, he argues, forces us to realism about universals; if we are to be realists about the physical world, we are forced to be realistic about the mental; so, if we are tempted by any realism, he argues, we should go all in. Not everyone will agree, of course, but the argument deserves careful attention. And even if one does not go with Chakrabarti all the way down the road he wishes to travel, or into each of the fascinating byways he explores along the way, the itinerary he develops is rich with ontological and epistemological insights, particularly about the relationship between different ontological and epistemological domains.

Chakrabarti's argument for realism follows a pattern. He assumes his reader is a realist about something. That something might be the external world, the mind, particulars, events, or anything else one might choose. And that realism might be contrasted with anti-realism about some related domain. Chakrabarti argues -- drawing on a masala of Indian and Western sources, as well as a good deal of original argument inspired by these sources -- that the realism one endorses entails a broader realism about the class of entities with which one might think it contrasts. Realism about the external world and realism about the mental; realism about particulars and realism about universals; realism about objects and realism about inherence; realism about speech and realism about meaning: all of these, Chakrabarti argues, are mutually entailing. No contrastive realism or anti-realism, he argues, is tenable.

For the most part, Chakrabarti keeps his eye on the ball. The book divides into three sections comprising twenty-five chapters. The first section is devoted to realism about external objects and its implications, both metaphysical and epistemological. The second addresses subjectivity, focusing primarily on the question of the reality of the self, of mental events, and of the epistemology of self-knowledge. The final section, with its double entendre title, is a bit less coherent in its organization. Several chapters, in particular, the last few -- on the future, on God, and on absences -- continue the argument from the first two sections in interesting directions. But they are preceded by six chapters on an assortment of epistemological issues that do not fit easily into the narrative arc of the book as a whole. Without these initial chapters in the third section, the volume is a coherent monograph: although it draws together a series of Chakrabarti's essays published over a quarter century, the volume itself, with the exception of these chapters, reflects careful reworking and joining, and reads as a sustained argument. But this group of chapters does give the final section the feel of an anthology instead of a monograph.

The first example of Chakrabarti's strategy of showing that realism in any domain entails a realism with regard to the entities with which that domain is supposed to contrast is the argument in chapter 1 to the effect that anti-realism about the self entails anti-realism about external objects. Chakrabarti sums up the conclusion in anticipation of the argument, which targets Buddhists and Humeans alike, this way:

I should like to argue that the picture of us as ownerless objectless rivers of consciousness fails to account for re-identificatory experience. By eventually fudging the distinction between one person and another, such reductionism blurs the private-public and the subjective-objective divides. This results in the unintelligibility of linguistic communication. Plain facts evaporate; licenses to make one's own world are issued; and supposed world-makers themselves continue dividing, merging, re-emerging, and partially surviving . . .  Maybe this entails liberation from egoism. But whose liberation will it be anyway? (9-10)

Not everyone will find the argument for this ambitious conclusion compelling (my own sense is that at critical junctures -- e.g., the argument that experience presupposes not merely persons, but selves -- important questions are begged, although, I assume, others will applaud). To the extent that it is compelling, Chakrabarti leads the reader to the conclusion that any selective realism is incoherent: take it all or nothing at all. The very perceptive discussions of Kant's account of the transcendental unity of apperception and his refutation of idealism, and of Udayana's (10th century) reply to the Buddhist rejection of a substantial self as analogous demonstrations of the need for an external world if we are to make sense of subjectivity, complete the biconditional for which the chapter argues: realism about the self and about the external world stand and fall together.

This dialectical strategy of demonstrating that pairs of realisms thought to be antagonistic to one another are in fact mutually entailing is particularly intriguing in the second and third chapters, in which Chakrabarti argues that realism about particulars and realism about universals entail one another, and defends the claim that we perceive universals. This chapter brings Strawson, David Armstrong, Pranab Kumar Sen, and the Nyāya tradition into a many-sided debate about how best to make sense of realism about universals, and about just which universals deserve realistic treatment and which do not.

A lot of heavy metaphysics gets done in a very short compass, and one sometimes has the feeling of viewing complex terrain from too high an altitude to appreciate the difficulties that arise on the ground. But despite the hard questions that are not really settled (in particular those concerning just how one restricts the class of real universals without arbitrariness or question-begging), the bird's eye view is worth the read, and the writing is clear enough that one can see where steps are missing. The discussion of the perception of universals is compelling, but could have been strengthened a good deal with more attention to contemporary discussions of perception in phenomenology and cognitive science. This is one area where the recent literature has a lot to offer, and so, in this instance, Chakrabarti's presentation feels thin or under-informed.

Chapter 7, on inherence, might occasion the most surprise among contemporary philosophers. Chakrabarti argues that "there is no 'out-there'ence without some ontic 'in-here'ence." (77) This quip gestures at the Nyāya inclusion of the inherence relation between substances and their attributes as one of its basic ontological categories. Chakrabarti argues, relying heavily on Udayana, and a bit on Frege ("The Thought") for several interrelated theses: realism about the self requires realism about external objects; realism about external objects entails that they exist and possess their properties independent of the mind; that property possession, whether mental or physical, requires a real relation of inherence between property bearers and their properties.

This chapter is rich in insight into the structure of debates regarding the mind-dependence or mind-independence of sensible objects, but at times feels a bit too swift, both in its endorsement of positions Chakrabarti defends, and in its dismissal of those he rejects. The attack on Yogācāra is particularly inadequate here, in part because of the broad doxographic brush with which he paints the school (not all Yogācārins are idealist in the sense he takes them to be) but more significantly because he attributes to (all) proponents of this school a significant distinction between the inner and the outer with the location of objects in the inner world.

This reading is at odds with important Yogācāra thinking about the mind (for instance Vasubandhu's (c. 320-380 CE) Trisvabhāvanirdśa and Trimśikakārikā, not to mention the Saṃdhinirmocana-sūtra, which is foundational to this school) in which that very distinction is attacked in defense of a non-duality of subject and object, and in general is textually unsupported. This issue has been addressed by Jonathan Gold, by myself, and by Roy Tzohar, and this interpretative line is simply ignored here, with the consequence that the attack on Yogācāra simply looks like it misses the point. There is simply more sophistication in the Yogācāra position than Chakrabarti acknowledges, including a subtle causal analysis of the way that the appearance of objects arises, and of the contribution of our cognitive and perceptual systems to our experience of the world that does not reduce to a simple internalism or a denial of the reality of the external world.

Moreover, any discussion of inherence as a real relation immediately raises the question of the third man: If inherence is a relation between substance and attribute, and so a property of that dyad, does that require a further relation of inherence? Is this regress vicious? Whatever one's position is on the resolution of this issue, it must be confronted in any discussion of inherence, and Chakrabarti simply never addresses it, leaving a significant lacuna in this important chapter.

Part II is devoted to the self and to subjectivity. Chakrabarti draws some nice connections between Jayanta Bhaṭṭa's (c. 19th century) argument for the reality and continuity for self from the fact of recognition and the arguments of the Kashmiri Śaiva philosophers Utpaladeva (900-950) and Abhinavagupta (950-1016) for the need of active synthesis by a subjective self for genuine subjectivity to be possible. Frege  and KC Bhattacharyya (1875-1949) also make cameo appearances in this chapter rich in its exploration of the necessary conditions of temporally extended subjectivity and of intentionality directed towards experiences at other times. Once again, the strategy is to grant a realism about the momentary experience that many Buddhist philosophers take to be constitutive of selfless cognitive continua and to argue that that realism forces realism regarding a synthesizing subject of those momentary awarenesses. The articulation of the orthodox arguments and the examination of their implications are superb. Unfortunately, there is no parallel consideration of possible Buddhist or Humean rejoinders; this would complete the work.

The topic of self-knowledge occupies a good deal of Part II. In chapter 14, Chakrabarti contrasts Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya views regarding the mechanisms by means of which we have knowledge of our own cognitive states. Mīmāṃsā philosophers argue that cognitions are self-revealing, that is, that our awareness of a mental state is achieved through that mental state itself, constituting a first-order account of self-knowledge. Nyāya philosophers such as Gaṅgeśa (12th century), whose views are under examination here, reject that account in favor of a higher-order theory.

This debate (which is left unresolved) opens an extended and deep discussion of the variety of self-luminosity or reflexivity theses regarding self-knowledge debated in classical Indian epistemology, ranging from strong reflexivist theses floated in Yogācāra Buddhism and Advaita Vedānta to the anti-reflexivism of later Nyāya philosophers. The survey reveals both the complex range of possibilities for a theory of self-knowledge as well as how much the Indian tradition, which was so preoccupied with this debate, has to offer current philosophy of mind. Chakrabarti ends up defending a sensible moderate fallibilism about self-knowledge, one consistent with a variety of the positions scouted in this chapter.

In chapters 15 and 16, Chakrabarti moves from epistemology back to metaphysics, asking not about how we know ourselves, but whether we are selves at all. He first launches a compelling transcendental argument against global fictionalism, or eliminativism, about the mental, reminiscent of those offered by Baker and Garfield. Even for there to be a fiction, there must be someone to craft and to consume it; to disbelieve in the mental is itself a mental event. The only quibble one might have with this chapter is the way that Madhyamaka Buddhism, represented by Candrakīrti (600-650), gets set up as a bit of a straw man at the outset. Chakrabarti neglects the important distinction Candrakīrti draws between the self (ātman) the existence of which he denies, and the person (pudgala) the conventional existence of which he affirms. If Candrakīrti is read correctly, while the arguments in this chapter are sound, they have nothing to do with his position, once again suggesting that Buddhist philosophers get short shrift in this study.

Things get more controversial in chapter16, which is a robust defense of Nyāya realism about the self, drawing on Gautama (c. 5th-6th century BCE), Vātsyāyana (c. 2nd-3rd century CE), Uddyotakara (c. 6th century CE) and Vācaspati (9th-10th century CE). The argument relies heavily on the Nyāya metaphysics of substance and attribute defended earlier in the volume, as well as a strong anti-materialism about mental properties. Chakrabarti demonstrates that if one accepts both the broad substantialist Nyāya framework and immaterialism about the mental, one is driven to accept the reality of a substantial but immaterial self as that in which mental properties inhere. This argument is buttressed by Gautama's proto-Kantian argument that a self is needed in order to bind sensory information from different modalities and to bind awarenesses obtained at different times into awarenesses of single external objects. Once again, realisms are argued to be intertwined: to be a realist about external objects, Chakrabarti argues, is to be a realist about the self; without a soul, he and his Nyāya colleagues argue, none of the sensations that even no-self Buddhists admit to be real, could be represented as of anything external.

The first few chapters in Part III, despite the fact that they seem like an island in the flow of the narrative, repay careful reading. I found them some of the most illuminating in the volume. Here Chakrabarti provides an eloquent account of the second person, and of the importance of interlocutors and of intersubjectivity for subjectivity. The discussion is grounded in the work of Abhinavagupta and of KC Bhattacharyya, as well as that of Strawson. Chakrabarti takes us through the importance of address in making sense of speech, and the importance of recognizing other minds in order to develop the concepts through which we recognize ourself as minded. The history of philosophy and the systematic philosophical argument in these chapters is very compelling.

There are a few general problems with the volume that deserve mention. Voicing is very important in a study that integrates quotation, exegesis, and independent argument to the extent that this book does, and the voicing is not always clear. At times material is simply quoted and discussed, so the reader may think that a particular view is merely being added to the context when in fact Chakrabarti intends to endorse that position, or to use it to advance the argument. At other times the reader may believe that a position is being defended when it is merely being set up for rebuttal. A bit more editorial care would have solved this problem.

A more significant issue is Chakrabarti's sometimes excessive reliance on doxographic categories in his articulation of ideas in Indian philosophy at the expense of recognizing and taking into account diversity of opinion within as well as among schools. So, views are attributed to Nyāya at times, without being ascribed to any particular Nyāya thinker, to Vedānta or to Mīmāṃsā, as opposed to any particular Vedāntin or Mīmāṃsīka. (See the references to Nyāya and the Buddhists on p. 9, for instance, or the overbroad claim on p. 46 that Buddhists argue that knowledge is "confined to ineffable simple apprehension," a claim that most Buddhists would in fact deny.) Although Chakrabarti is often careful about his sources and attributions, and while he is often very clear about diversity of views within schools, when these blanket attributions are employed, they can give the unwary reader an impression of more uniformity within philosophical schools that is warranted.

This problem is particularly evident in Chakrabarti's treatment of Buddhist ideas. He focuses almost exclusively on the Yogācāra school (see also the discussion of Buddhist reductionism and of the doctrine of reflexive awareness on pp. 11-12), and does not do enough to indicate the range of Buddhist positions, and the resources they offer for thinking through realism and anti-realism, particularly the Madhyamaka school. But even if we stick to Yogācāra there are issues to raise: Yogācāra is a vast tradition with a great deal of internal diversity. Chakrabarti focuses entirely on its idealistic strain, and there exclusively on the idealistic texts of Dignāga (c. 480-540 CE) and Vasubandhu (4th-5th century CE). The rich strain of phenomenology in Yogācāra thought, as well as Asaṅga's (4th-5th century CE) discussions of the relationship between the mental and the physical would have added considerable nuance to the presentation. As it is, the entire Buddhist tradition is represented primarily as an opponent or pūrvapakṣa for Śaṅkara (c. 9th century CE) or for the Nyāya tradition.

There is also an unfortunate tendency in parts of the book to go a bit too easy on Nyāya, a school with which Chakrabarti might well be identified. Indeed, at times, references to Nyāya positions seem to function as authority for positions Chakrabarti endorses, as opposed to citations of those with whom he agrees, or as arguments to be critically assessed or to be endorsed after examination. It would be helpful to the reader to treat the ideas and arguments presented by representatives of this school with the critical circumspection with which those coming from other schools are treated.

Vedānta also sometimes gets treated with kid gloves. In a generally superb chapter on idealistic refutations of idealism that creatively juxtaposes Śaṅkara's idealist Vedānta attack on Yogācāra idealism with Kant's transcendental idealist attack on Berkeley's and Descartes' respective idealisms, Chakrabarti does a superb job exploring the structure of Kant's argument, with sharp critical analysis. Again, not everyone will agree with his reconstruction or his critique, but it is a very plausible and detailed analysis. Śaṅkara, however, is given an easy ride, with his remarks summarized and taken as decisive without critique. There is indeed, a lot of room for debate here, and Yogācāra has considerable resources that are not brought into play. It is a pity that Chakrabarti misses this opportunity to explore the Indian inter-idealist debate with as much care as he does its European counterpart.

Finally, some topics are treated a bit too quickly and breezily, with important complications left aside. For instance, when Chakrabarti introduces worries about the reference of the first-person pronoun, and asserts that "we cannot let a singular term with a single sense pick out distinct particulars as referents," (5) he simply ignores the vast literature on indexicality and on the difference between character and content that has been brought to bear on the semantic analysis of such pronouns. Even if he prefers other approaches to thinking about the semantics of 'I', to write as though this has not been considered is too quick.

The one issue that Chakrabarti gets really wrong is the discussion in chapters 4 and 5 of the implications of the Kaplan-Montague Knower paradox for a theory of omniscience. The paradox was deployed by Roy Perrett in a critique of the Nyāya doctrine that whatever exists is knowable and nameable (Perrett refers to Fitch's version of the argument), and Chakrabarti misattributes the original argument to Perrett. The argument is sound and perplexing, and demonstrates that the concept of omniscience is paradoxical, a matter that Chakrabarti gets right (61-62). And Chakrabarti is also correct that given the difference between the discussion of omniscience in terms of the knowledge of truths and that in terms of acquaintance with objects, the argument does not directly undermine the Nyāya claim that all objects are knowable and nameable. But his attempted refutation of the argument itself fails, as it must.

Whatever problems there are in this book, however, are more than offset by it many virtues. There is a great deal more that can be said about this rich volume, which addresses far too many topics and far too many fascinating passages of philosophical argument to discuss in a single review. It is a book that anyone interested in realism-anti-realism debates must read. Suffice it to say that one cannot read this book without learning a lot. There is such a wealth of insight here, and such a wide-ranging discussion of the many issues involved in these debates and of the many contributions to these debates over centuries in India and the West, addressed with such intellectual acuity and panache that no other book on the topic is in the same league.

This is a book that must also be read by anybody interested in the history of Indian metaphysics and epistemology. While it is not a comprehensive history of Indian philosophy by any means, one can learn a great deal about the complex debates that animate that tradition and about the interactions between schools of thought through the prism offered by this volume. Finally, it is must reading for anybody interested in the enterprise of cross-cultural philosophy per se. This book is an object lesson in just how to pursue that craft, and a fine demonstration of the necessity of doing so if one really wants to understand a philosophical problem, and not merely to think about how that problem is seen within a particular tradition. We all owe Chakrabarti thanks and congratulations on such a massive achievement.


Baker, L. (1988). Saving Belief. Princeton. Princeton University Press.

Fitch, F. (1963). "A Logical Analysis of Some Value Concepts," Journal of Symbolic Logic 28, 135-142.

Garfield, J. (1988). Belief in Psychology: A Study in the Ontology of Mind. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Garfield, J. (2015). Engaging Buddhism: Why it Matters to Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.

Gold, J. (2006). "Yogācāra Strategies Against Realism Appearances (ākti) and Metaphors (upacāra)," Religion Compass. 21 Dec 2006.

Gold, J. (2014). Paving the Great Way: Vasubandhu's Unifying Buddhist Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press.

Perrett, R. (1999). "Is Whatever Exists Knowable and Nameable?," Philosophy East and West 49:4, 401-414,

Tzohar, R. (2018). A Yogācāra Buddhist Theory of Metaphor. New York: Columbia University Press.