Reality and Impenetrability in Kant's Philosophy of Nature

Placeholder book cover

Warren, Daniel, Reality and Impenetrability in Kant's Philosophy of Nature, Routledge, 2001, 99 pp., $60.00, ISBN 0-8153-4054-0.

Reviewed by Eric Watkins, University of California at San Diego


Daniel Warren’s Reality and Impenetrability in Kant’s Philosophy of Nature is a relatively short book (just shy of a hundred pages) and has not been updated or revised since it was accepted as a dissertation at Harvard in 1994, yet it still represents a very nice piece of original thinking on some fundamental issues in Kant’s metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of science. In the first chapter, Warren focuses on a truly neglected, but quite important issue in Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, namely the category of reality, supporting the novel view that it ought to be understood in terms of the notion of a causal power. In the second chapter, Warren argues that transcendental idealism be conceived in terms of the distinction between intrinsic and relational properties and thus that Kant’s assertion that we cannot know things in themselves follows from his claim that we can know only the relational, and not the intrinsic properties of things. In the third and final chapter, Warren combines the claims of the previous chapters to argue that Kant understands the reality that distinguishes filled from empty space not as a mechanist would, namely in terms of the intrinsic property of solidity—given that we do not know the intrinsic properties of things—but rather in terms of impenetrability, which is a relational, dynamical causal power.

The first chapter argues that insofar as the category of reality can be applied to the sensible qualities of objects, it can be distinguished from the pure, unschematized category (i.e., represented through the understanding alone) if and only if the sensible qualities or realities it represents are causal powers. Warren’s argument is this.

  • Realities are intensive magnitudes.
  • A magnitude is intensive if and only if it is not composed of mutually external, smaller parts, that is, does not display a part-whole relationship (as extensive magnitudes do).
  • Therefore, realities are not composed of mutually external smaller parts and do not display a part-whole relationship.
  • In order to represent x as a determinate magnitude (in the full sense), we must not only be able to represent an arbitrary y as equal to x, but also be able to represent an arbitrary z as being the sum of increments, one of which is equal to x.
  • If a quantity, x, displays a part-whole relationship, then we are able to represent an arbitrary z as being the sum of increments, one of which is equal to x (insofar as part-whole relationships evidence a congruence or equality relationship).
  • Since realities do not display a part-whole relationship, there is no guarantee that we can represent them as determinate magnitudes (in the full sense).
  • Realities can be represented as magnitudes (in the full sense) if and only if they are causal powers that have extensive magnitudes as their effects (since it is only through their causal relations to quantifiable effects, i.e., extensive magnitudes, that realities can represented as increments).
  • Realities are causal powers (that have extensive magnitudes as their effects).

The basic thrust of Warren’s argument is that since an intensive magnitude is both a magnitude—has increments that are equal to, greater than, or less than others—and intensive—does not consist of parts external to each other that could be comparable increments—it must be a causal power or ground that has effects that are composed of comparable increments.

(1)-(3) as well as (5) and (6) are relatively uncontroversial (at least in the context of Kant scholarship). The crucial steps of Warren’s argument are thus (4) and (7). Since (4) involves technical details about what it means to be a determinate magnitude in the full sense (i.e., not just as being greater than, less than, or equal to another, but as being represented as a comparable increment), and the textual evidence that would need to be considered for adequate treatment of this issue is complex, let us skip (4).

Two points are relevant to (7). First, the argument turns on the idea that causal powers are required to serve as a link between realities—which do not directly display a part-whole relationship or the kind of relationship that would be needed for them to be determinate magnitudes in the full sense—and determinate magnitudes in the full sense. While Warren does provide textual evidence that Kant sometimes thinks of causal powers as linking realities and magnitudes, it is not immediately clear that causal powers alone can do so. One might think that this restriction could be obvious from the context insofar as no other candidates for the linking role are available. However, there is some textual evidence that mitigates against the view, for, as Warren notes, Kant asserts that both consciousness and motion are intensive magnitudes. If the intensive magnitude of consciousness is the degree of clarity and distinctness our representations display, it is far from clear what is supposed to be the relevant causal power, especially if the causal power is supposed to have extensive magnitudes as effects. We may also not need to represent motion as a causal power in order to construct it as having a determinate magnitude. Rather, we can simply appeal to spatial and temporal coordinates, just as Kant does in the Phoronomy in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (MFNS).

Second, Warren stresses (p. 27) that the reference to causal powers is an observation not about how we measure intensive magnitudes, but rather about what intensive magnitudes are. However, in the Mechanics in the MFNS, Kant defines the quantity of matter in terms of the number of parts outside parts, but since matter is infinitely divisible, one cannot measure its quantity directly. Rather, one must measure a body’s quantity of matter indirectly, in terms of its quantity of motion at a given velocity. But since quantity of motion is in turn defined in terms of quantity of matter at a given velocity, it might appear that Kant’s account involves a vicious circle. Aware of the problem, Kant explicitly distinguishes between what the quantity of matter is (namely, the number of parts outside parts) from how it is measured, estimated, or manifested in experience. But if Kant distinguishes between what an extensive magnitude is and how it is measured, why can he not do the same for intensive magnitudes and hold that causal powers are simply important means for measuring them? As Kant’s further discussion of the quantity of matter reveals, though he insists that the quantity of matter must be estimated mechanically, he immediately points out that original attraction (an intensive magnitude) can be used to measure this quantity as well so that it is clear that invoking causal powers in measurement contexts is permissible. Thus, without irrefutable textual evidence it is hard to see that realities must be causal powers, even if one were to grant that causal powers are necessarily associated with them. At the same time, neither of these difficulties affects Warren’s ultimate thesis, since it is enough for his interpretation if impenetrability can be understood as a causal power.

In the second chapter, Warren discusses Kant’s notion of a thing in itself and his claim that we can have knowledge only of relations. Warren first suggests that Kant’s notion of a thing in itself should be understood not as what is ultimately real (as opposed to what is subject-dependent) nor as what we understand when abstracting from the conditions of sensibility, but rather as what can exist and be understood independently of its relations to other things. In this, Warren’s position is close to Rae Langton’s recently developed view. Warren then infers that Kant’s claim to ignorance about things in themselves follows from his claim that we can have knowledge only of relations (p. 47). If we can have knowledge only of relations and things in themselves have no relations, then it follows that we can have no knowledge of things in themselves. Yet, if this is the case, one might surmise that the very idea of a thing in itself is empty. Warren attempts to give content to the notion of a thing in itself by arguing that we can have an “idea” of things in themselves (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea”) if things in themselves function as unattainable endpoints of explanatory regresses. In this context, Warren emphasizes Kant’s distinction between absolutely and merely comparatively inward properties. For example, shape is often regarded as an inward property and can be used in certain explanatory contexts (e.g., to explain why an object shaped one way is better for certain purposes than one shaped differently). However, shape is only comparatively inward; it can, in turn, be explained by the external relations of the parts that constitute the shaped object. These parts, along with their properties, are not themselves absolutely inward, but rather rest on further relations between further parts, and the process of explanation continues indefinitely, since, Kant claims, we can never reach absolutely inward properties. Warren’s point, however, is that our ideas of things in themselves can still have a content because they can function as regulative ideals in this unending process of explanation.

Warren’s second chapter thus raises a number of important and complex issues—transcendental idealism, absolute versus comparatively inward properties, and the role of the thing in itself as a regulative ideal in scientific explanation. While I agree with Warren that transcendental idealism has an ontological (and not exclusively methodological or epistemological) dimension, the distinction between things in themselves and appearances cannot be drawn simply in terms of the distinction between intrinsic and relational properties. For one thing, a distinctive feature of Kant’s understanding of the intelligible world is that its substances stand in real relations to each other. Warren’s interpretation also raises a problem for understanding how things in themselves are supposed to ground or affect phenomena. For if things in themselves have only intrinsic properties and affection is a grounding relation between things in themselves and appearances, then either things in themselves, qua purely intrinsic properties, do not ground appearances (i.e., relate to appearances via affection) or they do ground appearances, but then also have relations (i.e., have properties other than intrinsic properties). Finally, by understanding transcendental idealism in terms of the intrinsic-relational distinction (rather in terms of what is real and hence fully determinate versus what is indeterminate in some respect and thus ideal), Warren has implicitly restricted the basis upon which Kant’s arguments for the ideality of appearances could be developed.

However these controversial issues are resolved, it should be noted that Warren’s basic stance implies that Kant’s argument for our ignorance of things in themselves stems simply from the claim that we can know only relational properties. Yet, as Karl Ameriks has argued, just as there are for Kant no “short” (or purely general) arguments to the subject-dependency of space and time (based solely on the nature of representation), so too there are for Kant no short arguments to our ignorance of things in themselves (based only on the distinction between intrinsic and relational properties). In conjunction with this, Warren’s view leaves Kant’s argument for our ignorance of things in themselves exposed to serious challenge. What is Kant’s argument for thinking that we can know only relational properties? Given that he rejects the idea (defended by Langton) that our knowledge might be restricted by the fact that objects must be given to us through our receptive faculty of sensibility, it remains mysterious as to why we cannot know any intrinsic properties. Is there something about the very idea of an intrinsic property that puts it beyond our ken (or is there rather some feature of how objects are given to us in space and time that prevents our knowing such features)? While Warren has made an interesting start in developing a novel line of interpretation, more still needs to be said on these issues.

Finally, how does Warren’s claim that things in themselves have only intrinsic properties sit with his interpretation of Kant’s claim that things in themselves function as regulative ideals? Since relational properties are explained by means of other relational properties, it remains unclear as to how invoking intrinsic properties is of any help. If one assumed that relational properties must be reduced to intrinsic properties, then things in themselves would be necessary for any ultimate explanation of relational properties, but if one rejects such an assumption at the explanatory level—as Kant clearly does in the Critique—then it remains unclear how intrinsic properties can play any regulating role. (Perhaps what is crucial about the way in which things in themselves can function as regulative principles is rather that they are the ultimately real unconditioned conditions of the conditioned objects that are given in experience.) At the same time, one can, once again, downplay the importance of understanding things in themselves in terms of intrinsic properties, since what is ultimately of importance to Warren’s case is his claim that things in themselves function as regulative ideals, a point that holds independently of understanding things in themselves as objects with intrinsic properties.

In the third chapter, Warren turns to Kant’s discussion of two different conceptions of impenetrability (or of how space is filled), the mechanical and the dynamical conceptions. The contrast between the two can be brought out by considering whether a body is impenetrable because it is solid (Lambert) or absolutely hard (Newton) as an atom would be, or rather because it has a dynamical force of resistance that fends off other bodies that might attempt to penetrate the space it is occupying (Leibniz). In the Dynamics of the MFNS, Kant favors the dynamical conception and, in a famous passage, argues against the mechanical conception (despite acknowledging several important advantages that the rival account enjoys). Warren presents a helpful description of these two conceptions and a detailed and penetrating analysis of Kant’s arguments against the mechanical conception. First, Warren shows that for Kant “absolute” impenetrability, which is invoked by the mechanist and implies infinitude, cannot be given in sensibility, since sensation is necessarily finite. Second, Warren illustrates how solidity is incompatible with the principle of continuity, which Kant argues for toward the end of the Second Analogy. Third, after elaborating Kant’s use of the notion of “the mere existence of a substance” (which would, according to the mechanist, include its solidity), Warren reconstructs Kant’s objection that resistance does not follow logically and analytically from the mere concept of the presence of a body in space as the mechanist would have it, but rather causally and synthetically. Kant’s fundamental idea is thus that the intrinsic properties of a thing, such as its solidity, are distinct from its relational properties, such as its causal powers, so that the mechanist is conflating two different kinds of properties by attempting to invoke solidity (an intrinsic property) as an explanation of impenetrability (a causal relational property).

Warren then links his analysis of the distinction between intrinsic and relational properties with Kant’s claim that we cannot comprehend the possibility of fundamental forces. According to Warren, Kant rejects the idea that we could comprehend the possibility of fundamental forces because “any demand that we come to know how … effects are produced [by fundamental forces] involves a claim to be able to know things as they are in themselves” (p. 90). In other words, because solidity is an intrinsic property and because only unknowable things in themselves have intrinsic properties, solidity is unknowable. Moreover, even though explaining relational forces in terms of an intrinsic property such as solidity would in fact count as an explanation of a fundamental force, according to Warren, Kant argues that since we have no knowledge of the intrinsic properties of things in themselves that fundamental forces would be based on, we cannot have insight into fundamental forces either.

There is much in this third and final chapter, in particular, that I find valuable and helpful, such as Warren’s insightful analysis of Kant’s understanding of solidity as an intrinsic rather than relational property and his explanation of why it might lead him to reject solidity. Still, I do have one reservation about Warren’s understanding of why Kant claims that we cannot have any insight into fundamental forces. Warren holds that explaining the possibility of a fundamental force would require knowledge of things in themselves and since the latter cannot be had, neither can the former. And, confronted with Kant’s assertion that fundamental forces are unknowable, it is tempting to infer that they must be noumenal. Yet I think that such a temptation should be resisted. The problem with Warren’s explanation of the unknowability of fundamental forces is that it seems to require that Kant be making the very mistake that he attributes to the mechanist. That is, the mechanist wants to explain the relational property of resisting the approach of other substances by means of an intrinsic property (solidity). Kant would be making the same mistake if he thought that any explanation of a fundamental force would have to be in terms of the intrinsic properties of things in themselves.

It would be preferable if an explanation of the incomprehensibility of fundamental forces could be given that was consistent with Kant’s own positive epistemology and metaphysics. Without going into details, Kant’s main point could simply be that having insight into fundamental forces would require constructing them in intuition a priori, which is, however, not possible for forces, since they involve existence claims (which cannot be constructed a priori). This main point is also compatible with another idea Kant entertains throughout his career, namely that even if one could explain how various effects are to be subsumed under a single kind of force, that would still not explain how one thing could bring about a new determination in a separate thing. That is, we cannot truly grasp either by intuition or reason (in a way that might satisfy Hume or Leibniz) how it is that the state of one independently existing thing can follow causally from another. For Kant concedes to Hume both that we cannot have an impression of causation and that pure reason cannot comprehend a necessary connection between two independent substances (by means of the principle of contradiction). Even if Kant argues that we must believe that substances exercise their causal powers, we do not therefore fully understand how such a necessary connection is possible. Such an interpretation could, I think, be supported with passages from the pre-Critical period, such as the “Negative Magnitudes” essay and other Reflexionen from the early 1760s, though this is not the place to develop such an interpretation.

This is rather the place to praise and admire Warren’s book. For, in relative isolation from the work of others, he has produced a gem of a dissertation, combining textual sensitivity with philosophical subtlety in pursuing connections between several important issues in Kant’s natural philosophy and metaphysics. Despite the reservations I have expressed about a few of its central theses, it should be clear that I think that they do not at all require the abandonment of Warren’s approach, but rather leave ample room for modification and further clarification. I am sure that I am not alone in looking forward to seeing Warren explore this territory in future work.