Reality and Its Dreams

Placeholder book cover

Raymond Geuss, Reality and Its Dreams, Harvard University Press, 2016, 300pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674504950.

Reviewed by Enzo Rossi, University of Amsterdam


Raymond Geuss is one of the two pivotal figures in the recent and growing revival of realism in political philosophy. The other figure is Bernard Williams. Williams' work has received more constructive critical discussion and less praise and invective than Geuss'. This is understandable, given Geuss' reluctance to play by the rules of 'professional' scholarship. It is also regrettable insofar as Geuss exemplifies what is perhaps a more dramatic break with the mainstream, both substantively and methodologically: substantively because of his hostility to liberalism, and methodologically because of his hostility to (standard) normative theorising. The present book is a collection of essays that should be of interest to those who intend to explore the promise of realism's radical current.[1] It is an eclectic collection. Geuss makes 'no apology . . . for the fact that the last half dozen or so chapters treat issues that do not belong to the recognized standard inventory of "topics in political philosophy"', since he thinks that 'the traditional focus of the subject is too narrow' (ix). In fact, though they become sparser as the book proceeds, there are observations of relevance to political philosophy in almost every essay. Those observations will be my focus here. I will try and show the ways in which Geuss' new work may advance the (radical) realist programme. The main contribution in the new essays, as I see it, is the emphasis on the counterintuitively transformative potential of a realist approach, as opposed to the false promise of highly moralised approaches. I will also highlight some open questions about Geuss' realism, primarily to do with his contextualism and with the role of feasibility constraints.

Geuss' realism has a pars destruens and a pars construens, though they are closely related. Let us start from the former. One cannot help noticing a polemical streak throughout many of the essays This may irritate some readers, especially as Geuss does not extend interpretive charity to his opponents, to put it mildly. So this book will polarise opinion. Those who think that Guess is fundamentally fighting the good fight will read it charitably and find plenty of insight in it. I do. Those who are attached to a view of political philosophy as applied moral philosophy will understandably balk at Guess' sweeping tirades against various sacred cows. For instance, Geuss says that the similarities between Rawls' position and Ayn Rand's are more important than the differences (83), and that British comedian Russell Brand's Revolution is a more important work of political philosophy than either A Theory of Justice or Anarchy, State and Utopia (64ff).

There may be a case to be made for this lack of charity,[2] though one may still question whether that is enough to let Geuss off the hook. The case has to do with the reach of the by now fairly familiar realist critique of the moralism of mainstream political philosophy. The critique is usually cashed out as a methodological one, albeit one that is motivated by a substantively different understanding of the nature of politics.[3] The general idea is that the mainstream approach of deriving political prescriptions from pre-political moral commitments is unfit for purpose: 'To engage in "moralizing" is to make a moral judgment in an inappropriate context, that is, to propound it in a context or in a way which seems to ascribe to it too much of the wrong kind of weight or effectiveness.' (96) Crudely, politics just is the sort of activity that begins when morality runs out. We would not need politics if morality could do the job that political moralists assign to it. 'Moralism is focused on individual decision-making' (34), but 'politics is not applied individual morality' (48).

As I understand Geuss' position, there are three related claims here. The first is a rejection of a kind of methodological individualism in political philosophy, akin to his rejection of methodological individualism in social science (103, 105). The second is that there is something off, even perverse, about trying to use morality to regulate relations between strangers with vastly different conceptions of the good and -- importantly for realists -- interests. The issue of interests points to a third line of argument that is especially important for a Critical-Theory-minded realist like Geuss. It is a line of argument that should go some way towards explaining Geuss' lack of charity towards moralist political philosophers. Reliance on morality suggests an aspiration towards an equitable reconciliation of conflicts of values and interests, which in turn could be seen as a form of ideological political quietism that papers over structural social conflict. So Geuss says of the Kantian morality that informs so much Anglo-American political philosophy that it 'moves . . . very much in the direction of the arts of acceptance. [Kant] offers the agent not guidance for action but what he himself calls "consolation."' (59). Perhaps one needs hyperbolic, uncharitable criticism to cut through a veneer of academic politesse whose primary social function is not the pursuit of the truth but the reinforcement of power structures. Whether that is a false dichotomy, however, is a question Geuss leaves unanswered.

Another question one may raise, and one of a more manageable scope for our present purposes, concerns Geuss' point about the lack of action-guidance in moralist political philosophy. That point may seem at odds with Geuss' protestations against contemporary political philosophy's emphasis on normativity -- normativism, to use a term Geuss adopts from recent Frankfurt School-style Critical Theory:[4]

The academic reflection of the massive social and economic changes that took place between 1970 and 1981 could be seen in the gradual marginalization of serious social theory and political philosophy, and particularly of "leftist" thought. . . . Rather than the publication of A Theory of Justice being a renewal of political philosophy, it seems to me more fruitful to see it as part of a failure of nerve, and a turning away from the real world of institutions, politics and history toward the never-never land of purely normative theory. (81)

So Rawls' masterpiece would be little more than 'an exercise in trying to mobilize some half-understood fragments of Kant to give a better foundation to American ideology than utilitarianism had been able to provide' (82). Indeed:

the "normative turn" is best understood as a counterrevolution against historically and sociologically sophisticated views about ethics and politics developed in the period of Herder and Marx . . . The reasons for the success of "normative approaches" include the failure of the movements for political, social, and economic change of the 1960s, and the especial suitability of normativism as an ideology for the established economic and political structures that, after the challenge of the 1960s, were able to entrench themselves even more firmly than before. (ix)

One may rather think that "normativism" is animated precisely by a preference for action-guidance over understanding and critique of social and political structures. But Geuss' point is that one should refuse this sort of positivistic dichotomy between prescription and description. Purely prescriptive, moralistic political philosophy has only the surface appearance of action-guidance, whereas its actual social function is to reinforce dominant social structures by convincing us of their moral perfectibility -- this is indeed the source of Geuss' acrimony towards Rawls and other ostensibly progressive liberal thinkers, who 'bask in a warm and comforting glow of self-righteousness while remaining firmly within the limits set for the self-reproduction of the basic economic framework, and indeed strengthening this framework.' (99)

Whatever one may make of that critique -- and of the fact that Geuss does not bother mentioning the arguably more extreme and so contemptible moralism found in a self-proclaimed Marxist like G.A. Cohen -- it is worth noting that the critique does not operate at the level on engagement conventional in current academic political philosophy. It is not a point about false premises or conclusions that do not follow. It is a piece of ideology critique. It says that, regardless of its authors' intentions, much contemporary political philosophy is not what it purports to be. So this is an empirical point, albeit not empirical in the narrow sense that affords normativism's strict fact-value distinction. The line between facts and values is both politically and philosophically up for grabs.

Geuss does not identify his preferred alternative approach to a naive "just the facts, ma'am" with any degree of clarity. But asking that question brings us to the pars construens of his realism. In a perceptive essay on Marxism's legacy, he sketches the epistemological outlook that underpins his view. He exhorts us to challenge methodological individualism and resurrect a more critical, anti-positivist philosophy of social science (103-105), which in turn would have transformative implications for our way of doing political philosophy -- perhaps most notably by shifting the focus away from moral intuitions as the bedrock of political prescriptions, as that leaves 'no possibility for serious ideological criticism' (115).

That sketch and others in other essays will not satisfy those who look for a systematic, worked-out theory. Nonetheless, in addition to the reclaiming of anti-normativist Marxian ideology critique, one can identify two further tenets of Geuss' radical political realism. The first one is a kind of contextualism about political judgment:

The "moralist" thinks it is possible to attain a kind of absoluteness, apodicticity, and definite determinateness of judgment that the "realist" denies is possible. In particular, "realism" ought to be committed to a certain kind of open-endedness, indeterminacy, and context-dependence of judgment, or at any rate to agnosticism about absolute and categorical claims. (28)

The important point here is the contrast between a "normativistic" political philosophy that looks like an applied version of Williams' "peculiar institution" of morality, and a form of contextualism that, however, Geuss is keen to distinguish from what he takes to be the philosophical scarecrow of relativism: 'Some version of realism may properly be said to emphasize the "relativity" of judgment, but even this "relativity" is not at all like the "relativism" that traditional philosophers since Plato have analysed and criticized.' (Ibid.) Geuss then goes to some lengths to try and substantiate this last claim. Here one should note that, while his discussion is argumentatively resourceful, it creates an artificial 'bĂȘte noire' (50) much like the one Geuss thinks Plato created. Besides, it is unclear why one should want to avoid philosophers' relativism at a time when this position is being reformulated and rehabilitated in the flourishing philosophical literature on the "new relativism"[5] -- which in turn is a reason to be less pessimistic than Geuss about analytic philosophy's 'proselytizingly conformist streak' (8), especially as the "new relativism" is conceptually connected to the recent revival of ideology critique within analytic philosophy.[6]

The second tenet is the idea that, contrary to what the ordinary term "realism" may suggest and contrary to what their moralist critics suggest, political realists need not acquiesce to the status quo. For one thing, realists should be weary of the quasi-technocratic discourse on feasibility, for our sense of what is possible does not float free of ideological accounts of "the facts on the ground" (44-45). Anti-positivism again does a lot of the work here, but this is also a point that resonates with other realists' attempt to distinguish their approach from non-ideal theory: realism is anti-moralism and fidelity to an appropriately specified class of facts, but those need not be facts about feasibility.[7] However it is not always clear whether Geuss wants to pursue that sort of line, or indeed what his line is, exactly. At times he seems interested in a critically enhanced notion of feasibility, and even utopia: rather than being bound by our current needs, desires, and motivations, we must consider what they may become -- but we must also avoid the sort of utopianism that only provides an image of the final ideal state, without an account of the steps that can get us there, however transformative those may be (47). Elsewhere he seems to embrace a form of pessimistic, quasi-Adornian negativism that is compatible with a wholesale rejection of any notion of feasibility: 'If one really thinks that the society is completely corrupt or about to collapse in on itself, perhaps it is in no way unreasonable to put to it demands that cannot be satisfied.' (143)

To be sure, those two positions are not mutually exclusive. One lesson of Geuss' contextualism is precisely that different predicaments should yield different political judgments. In any case the tension between critical utopianism and pessimistic negativism has potential to become a productive one. Realist work in political philosophy is finally beginning to move away from methodological discussions and towards broadly normative questions, or rather questions of political judgment, as most realists would prefer to say.[8] But most of this work pursues the liberal realist agenda set out by Bernard Williams. Reality and Its Dreams should provide plenty of stimuli for those interested in unpacking the radical side of political realism.

[1] Cf. Prinz, J., 2015. Raymond Geuss' radicalization of realism in political theory. Philosophy & Social Criticism, doi: 10.1177/0191453715583711.

[2] Cf. Finlayson, L., 2015. The Political is Political (Rowman and Littlefield), Chapter 3.

[3] Cf. Sleat, M., 2016. Realism, Liberalism and Non-ideal Theory. Or, Are there Two Ways to do Realistic Political Theory? Political Studies, vol. 64 no. 1: 27-41.

[4] Jaeggi, R. 2013. Kritik von Lebensformen (Suhrkamp).

[5] Cf. MacFarlane, J. 2014. Assessment Sensitivity (Clarendon Press), to name just the most influential contributor to this turn in analytic philosophy.

[6] Cf. Haslanger, S., 2012. Resisting Reality (Oxford University Press), Stanley, J. 2015. How Propaganda Works (Princeton University Press) and, on the connection between analytic ideology theory and radical political realism, Prinz, J. and Rossi, E., forthcoming, Political Realism as Ideology Critique. Critical Review of Social and International Political Philosophy.

[7] Rossi, E. and Sleat, M., 2014. Realism in Normative Political Theory. Philosophy Compass, vol. 9 no. 10: 741-744; Rossi, E., 2015. Being Realistic and Demanding the Impossible. Working paper.

[8] Cf. Hall, E., 2015. How to do realistic political theory (and why you might want to). European Journal of Political Theory, doi: 10.1177/1474885115577820; Jubb, R., 2015. The Real Value of Equality, Journal of Politics vol. 77 no. 3: 679-691; Rossi, E., forthcoming. Understanding Religion, Governing Religion: A Realist Perspective, in C. Laborde and A. Bardon, eds, Religion in Liberal Political Philosophy (Oxford University Press); Sleat, M., 2013. Liberal Realism (Manchester University Press).