Reality and Rationality

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Wesley C. Salmon (Phil Dowe and Merrilee H. Salmon, eds.), Reality and Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2005, 304pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195177843.

Reviewed by Ned Hall, Harvard University


This fine collection brings together, in updated form, ten of Salmon's essays on central topics in the epistemology of science; two more were written especially for inclusion in the volume. The quality is uniformly high, and both philosophers of science and epistemologists will find a great deal of value here. In addition -- and this, to me, was quite a pleasant surprise -- historians of science will find several essays that directly and sharply challenge certain assumptions, widespread in that field, about the relationship between history and philosophy of science; these essays (in particular, chapters 4 through 6) should be required reading. Finally, every reader will find pleasure in Salmon's graceful prose, and his talent for clear, forceful, and wholly unpretentious exposition.

Two of the most prominent topics in these essays, and the ones to which I will confine my remarks, are scientific realism and the foundations of scientific confirmation -- in particular, the role that Bayesian principles play in a proper theory of confirmation. Let us consider these topics in turn.

Salmon is an unabashed realist, and the first three essays contain a brief but potent defense. He structures this defense by appeal to a distinction that he characterizes as "by no means sharp but nevertheless useful", between direct and indirect methods for acquiring knowledge (or at least justified belief) about unobservables: the former involve the use of technologies that in some way extend our perceptual faculties, whereas the latter involve a more circuitous epistemic route by way of suitable scientific theories. Chapter 3 contains an extended and brilliant discussion of a shining example of the indirect method, which was Perrin's experimental ascertainment of Avogadro's number, and corresponding confirmation of the atomic hypothesis. Salmon notes, with approval, that virtually every scientist at the time took Perrin's confirmation to be decisive; he rests much of his case for scientific realism on a careful and philosophically acute reconstruction of Perrin's reasoning. (It is, of course, not that without Perrin there would be no case for realism; it is, rather, that for Salmon this example vividly displays a kind of evidential reasoning that can warrant near certainty in a substantive claim about unobservables.) Highly compressed, the reconstruction proceeds as follows:

First, a significant number (thirteen) of radically different experimental techniques agree, to within close approximation, on their assessment of Avogadro's number N. Next, these techniques are radically different in a way that warrants two probabilistic judgments: On the assumption that the atomic hypothesis is false, the probability that any given technique would yield a particular value for N is independent of the probability that all others would yield that value; second, for any particular value, the probability that any given technique would yield that value is small. So -- again, on the assumption that the atomic hypothesis is false -- the probability that all 13 techniques yield approximately the same value is astronomically small. By contrast, the probability that they yield close to the same value on the assumption that the atomic hypothesis is true is comparatively large. Salmon articulates this reasoning in much more detail, arguing -- perhaps correctly, but in a way that doesn't really affect the strength of his case for realism -- that it is a species of reasoning to a common cause. I am quite persuaded. In fact, I think it would be irrational for anyone apprised of the evidence Salmon lays out (and not in possession of some remarkably strong countervailing evidence) to seriously doubt the truth of the atomic hypothesis. What's more, Salmon's reliance on this argument points to an attractively piecemeal way of defending scientific realism, according to which that defense best proceeds on a case-by-case basis. That is, while Salmon's argument is reminiscent of "no-miracles" arguments for scientific realism (which claim, roughly, that the historical success of scientific theorizing would be a miracle were it not the case that mature scientific theories were mostly true), it is much more tightly focused, in a way that I think renders it immune from certain critiques of its overly ambitious kin (e.g., van Fraassen's complaint that broadly Darwinian mechanisms, acceptable to the anti-realist, could just as well explain the historical success of science).

Still, I have two reservations, one minor and the other a bit more serious. Salmon frames his dispute with the anti-realist around what he calls the "key question": "whether inductive reasoning contains the resources to enable us to have observational evidence for or against statements about unobservable entities and/or properties" (p. 10). Now, I think Salmon has done a real service to the debate in emphasizing that the central issue dividing realist from anti-realist is a purely epistemic one, concerning the kind of evidential warrant provided to claims about unobservables by observational evidence. But his particular way of stating this issue may invite a regrettable misreading of where the burden of proof lies, and how much of a burden there is. Salmon encourages this misreading with the following footnoted comment: "I agree with van Fraassen's criticism, at least to the extent of endorsing the view that any empiricist who wants to be a realist must be prepared to exhibit the inductive logic or theory of confirmation in which the required inferences can be carried out." I think this is a mistake, on a par with holding that before the development of deductive logic, mathematicians who wished to uphold the conclusions of their mathematical arguments as true were not entitled to do so. In the case at hand, we come equipped with a wide range of extremely firm intuitive judgments about what observational evidence counts as epistemic warrant for what, and I see no reason to think that we must await the provision of a worked out theory of confirmation before we can legitimately treat these intuitions as reliable. (That is not to say that a theory of confirmation couldn't improve matters, any more than that the development of deductive logic added no epistemic improvements to mathematics.) And it seems blindingly obvious that these intuitions support realism -- just consult your own intuitive judgments about the epistemic warrant conferred by Perrin's evidence on the atomic hypothesis.

At any rate, there is a more important point. Remember that Salmon's opponent is not some sort of global skeptic about the empirical world, but holds, only with respect to a specific range of claims about that world (namely, claims about unobservables, whichever exactly those are), that observational evidence can never rationally compel belief about them (or even high degree of credence). The burden-shifting question that needs to be pressed upon such an antirealist is obvious: what is the salient epistemic difference between claims about things that are unobservable and claims about things that are unobserved? Van Fraassen, for example, seems to think that telescopes can provide us with rationally compelling evidence that Jupiter has moons, but that microscopes cannot provide us with rationally compelling evidence that cells have nuclei (or even that there are cells, I suppose). Why? Because, in principle, we could travel to Jupiter and see the moons directly, without aid of telescopes. But that this could be taken seriously as a decisive epistemic difference strikes me as daft.[1]

In short, the burden is squarely on the anti-realist to explain why his position is epistemically stable, and does not simply collapse into global skepticism. I would thus have preferred it if Salmon had treated the refutation of anti-realism not as an urgent priority, but rather as an occasion for doing something more interesting, which is to explore in some detail the exact ways in which observational evidence can indirectly but decisively confirm substantive claims about unobservables. At any rate, he succeeds in this latter task admirably.

The second reservation is more serious. To bring it into focus, consider an anti-realist somewhat different from van Fraassen, who states her position thus:

I grant that we know some things about unobservable, and in particular microscopic, aspects of reality. But I think that we know very little, and that our situation is never likely to improve. Consider the history of physics: first we were told, by the mechanists, that microscopic bits of reality were characterized in part by their bulk; then we were told, by the Newtonians, that they were characterized in part by their mass (which, as any good historian will remind you, is not at all the same as bulk); now we are told by string theorists that they are characterized by something else altogether. On the basis of a pessimistic induction, I conclude that we will never know anything about the fundamental nature of microscopic reality; as a corollary, we are not now entitled to believe the claims our best physics makes about this nature. So while I am perfectly happy to grant (unlike van Fraassen) that we have overwhelming evidence in favor of the atomic hypothesis, I find that much less of an achievement than Salmon does. To put the point crudely, I claim that we have no clear conception of what the content of that hypothesis is. Put forth any specific, substantive model of what atoms are, and we can be highly confident that the model is false; all that we are really entitled to believe is that, somehow or other, it is a nonaccidental fact about our world that these models yield very accurate predictions. That certainly makes me less of an antirealist than van Fraassen, but not so much less that I don't deserve the name.

Now, I do not myself think that this antirealist position is correct. For example, I think that we in fact possess detailed knowledge of the structure and internal nature of molecules and atoms. At the same time, I have no confidence whatsoever that our best current physics is anywhere close to right about the fundamental nature of the physical world. I conclude that, somehow or other, our empirically well-grounded knowledge of molecular and atomic structure must be the sort of thing that can survive wholesale revisions in our conception of the fundamental natures of the constituents of molecules and atoms. For example, we can be perfectly and justifiably confident that methane has a tetrahedral structure, even if our current best explanation of what it is for it to have that structure is fatally flawed. It's an interesting puzzle how exactly we can manage to be in such an epistemic situation. The only point I wish to emphasize here is that, while Salmon's arguments seem to me quite effective when directed against the overweening anti-realism of van Fraassen, it is much less clear to me how they make progress against the more restrained, but still fairly serious, anti-realism that denies the stability of the epistemic position I claim that we are in.

Let me turn now to Salmon's treatment of issues at the foundations of the theory of confirmation. The nine chapters devoted to these issues are rich in philosophically rewarding material: Salmon covers everything from the analogies and deep disanalogies between deductive logic and inductive reasoning, to the application of Bayesian principles to debates about the relative status of history and philosophy of science, to Hume's treatment of natural theology in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. I will zero in on one issue that seems to me fundamental, which is the status Salmon accords to Bayesian priors.

Consider a situation where, against some background of knowledge K, evidence E comes along that bears on some hypothesis H. Salmon is masterful at displaying the systematic advantages of analyzing the evidential bearing of E on H through a Bayesian lens -- so that, crucially, one must consider rival hypotheses to H, evaluating both the likelihood of E on each of these rivals, and their respective prior probabilities. Now, a Bayesian of an orthodox personalist persuasion would take these prior probabilities simply to be subjective degrees of belief of some scientist, perhaps emphasizing that they are "prior" only in a relative sense -- i.e., they may have resulted from even earlier subjective degrees of belief by conditionalizing on some previously gathered evidence. Salmon is not satisfied with this approach, and his dissatisfaction leads him to develop a rival view according to which more properly objective criteria should be used in determining the values of these prior probabilities. Here is a helpful summary statement:

… I have long maintained a view regarding the confirmation of scientific hypotheses that might suitably be called objective Bayesianism. One key feature of this approach to confirmation is that the prior probabilities of hypotheses are to be construed as frequencies. A plausibility judgment [which, for Salmon, is the sort of judgment upon which an assignment of a prior probability must be based] should identify a hypothesis as one of a given type, and it should estimate the frequency with which hypotheses of that type have succeeded. (p. 150; Salmon's italics)

I fully agree with Salmon that the problems that beset an orthodox Bayesian treatment of priors are devastating. Very briefly, if there are no constraints on what counts as a rationally appropriate distribution of priors, aside from the constraint that they conform to the probability calculus, then what results is really an irrationalist position. For example, if one scientist happens to have priors biased in favor of grue-like hypotheses, then, even when properly conditionalizing on the same evidence as his peers, he can easily end up with opinions wildly divergent from theirs -- and manifestly irrational. (Convergence theorems are of no help whatsoever: all they show -- and this, only under special conditions -- is that for any two priors, there is some evidence such that conditionalizing those priors on it will yield converging posteriors. But, of course, what one wants is a version of this claim with the quantifiers switched: there is some evidence, such that for any two priors, conditionalizing them on that evidence will yield converging posteriors. Alas, this stronger claim is straightforwardly false.) But I doubt that Salmon's hopeful reliance on frequencies will really help here. To cite just the most obvious of many problems, given any frequency data, we need to know how to interpret it. That is, what count as appropriate and inappropriate ways of defining the relevant reference classes? Here, the "grue" problem will simply reemerge in the form of grue-like methods for defining these reference classes. More generally, it appears that what Salmon is offering us is a two-factor epistemology: there is the Bayesian component, which tells you what to do once you have priors (and likelihoods) in hand, and then there is some other component, which tells you how to get those priors. While, throughout these essays, Salmon excels at deploying and exposing the limitations of the Bayesian apparatus, it seems to me that he offers us only the most programmatic remarks on how to construct the crucial second component of his epistemology. I do not find its prospects encouraging.

I think there's a deeper problem, which consists in a fundamental tension between two of Salmon's commitments. On the one hand, he wants a theory of confirmation to have a suitably objective basis; that is why he rejects the orthodox Bayesian view that the priors are nothing more than some agent's subjective degrees of belief, criticizable only if they fail to conform to the probability calculus. On the other hand, Salmon is quite explicit that his commitment to what he thinks of as empiricism requires him to reject any claims to synthetic a priori knowledge. Here is a beautifully telling passage:

… it is impossible to be completely open-minded, so we must find some basis for assigning negligible prior probabilities to some possible hypotheses. This is tantamount to judging some hypotheses to be too implausible to deserve further testing and consideration. It is my conviction that this is done on the basis of experience; it is not done by means of purely a priori considerations, nor is it a purely subjective affair. (p. 81; italics added)

I do not think the italicized claim is tenable. In fact, I think it is not at all difficult to exhibit concrete examples of substantive biases our credences must have, on pain of irrationality, and quite independently of the observational evidence available to us. Consider Billy and Suzy, two physicists who are in possession of exactly the same observational evidence. (Never mind that that is a hopelessly idealized stipulation.) Suzy, on the basis of this evidence, assigns a very high credence to the claim that Newtonian mechanics is correct. That is, she judges it overwhelmingly likely that our world is one of a range of possible worlds that can be characterized by specifying (i) a set of possible initial conditions; and (ii) dynamical equations that describe the deterministic evolution of these initial conditions. Billy judges a different theory to be very likely, on the basis of the same evidence. According to him, Suzy is exactly right about the range of possible initial conditions, but subtly wrong about the dynamical equations. For there is a special region of space-time, distinguished as such by the way physical objects within it behave. Outside this region, Suzy's equations are correct; inside it, different equations take over. What's more, these new equations cover their tracks in such a remarkable fashion that no trace of the bizarre, non-Newtonian behavior that takes place inside the Special Region carries forth into its future. (Billy will be happy to provide the equations, on request.)

Billy's theory is strongly incompatible with Suzy's, in the sense that any complete history compatible with her theory will be contradicted by his. But, provided that we are not in the midst of the Special Region (and to guarantee that, let it be a very small region, that exists long ago and far away…), the two theories are by construction exactly empirically equivalent. All the same, Billy is crazy. More exactly, if we let B be the claim that Billy's theory is true, and S be the claim that Suzy's theory is true, then for any rational credence, we should have P(S | S or B) ≈ 1. Any rational credence -- including that of an agent who has not yet examined any evidence that could possibly bear on the truth of S or B.

If this is right, then synthetic a priori knowledge (or at least: rationally mandated high degree of belief) is cheap. In fact, I think our possession of it -- lots of it -- is guaranteed by our ability to draw any rationally mandated conclusion on the basis of observational evidence that logically goes beyond that evidence. The general schema is this: where total evidence E rationally mandates high degree of belief in H, the material conditional E H must be a synthetic claim such that we are rationally required to assign a high degree of belief, prior to the acquisition of any evidence. (Stronger: the rational prior conditional probability P(H | E) must be high.) But I do not think that Salmon's commitment to empiricism need have led him to reject this claim; for the sense in which this knowledge is "a priori" is a rather weak one that wholly consists in its failing to be a posteriori -- it doesn't follow that we acquire it by exercising, for example, some special Cartesian faculty. What's more, recognizing the need for substantive constraints on priors that do not derive from empirical considerations likely obviates the need for a two-factor epistemology such as Salmon's -- which may be just as well, as there is reason to doubt that Salmon's second factor can do the work he sets for it.

[1]Thanks here to Tim Maudlin for helping me to see this point so clearly.