Reality Making

Placeholder book cover

Mark Jago (ed.), Reality Making, Oxford University Press, 2016, 200pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755722.

Reviewed by Ricki Bliss, Lehigh University


It would be hard for anyone interested in metaphysics not to have noticed the recent explosion of interest in notions of ground, ontological dependence, metaphysical structure, fundamentality and their like. Although doubtless the mushrooming of the literature devoted to these themes, and the cottage industry associated with them, has sprung from soils made fertile by time, sometimes one wonders what metaphysicians even did before Kit Fine told us we ought to be worried about grounding.

Mark Jago's edited collection offers eight new papers that contribute to the rapidly expanding literature on reality and its structure. Where this volume is, perhaps, unique and somewhat refreshing is that its focus is less on meta-issues pertaining to the over-arching structure of reality, and the kinds of concepts we use to understand it, and more on how certain first-order issues, particularly those associated with essentialism, can be brought to the conversation.

The volume opens with Martin Glazier's 'Laws and the Completeness of the Fundamental', in which he develops an account of the explanatory relationship between the derivative and the fundamental that makes appeal to the notion of the laws of metaphysics. In particular, what Glazier is concerned with is how, supposing there is something fundamental, whatever it is that is fundamental explains everything else. This paper offers an interesting discussion of some tricky issues pertaining to the connection between the fundamental and the derivative. And it makes a valuable contribution to what is, I hope, a growing body of literature devoted to filling in the details of a broader picture of reality -- one according to which there is something fundamental that gives rise to everything else - that we are so often told is intuitive and natural.

Naomi Thompson introduces and defends a view she calls 'metaphysical interdependence'. The current orthodoxy in the grounding literature is a species of metaphysical foundationalism: reality is hierarchically structured with chains of entities ordered by relations of ground terminating in something fundamental. Thompson argues that we have compelling reasons to take an alternative to this view seriously.

What does metaphysical interdependence commit us to? Unlike foundationalism, interdependence denies the well-foundedness of the grounding relation. And unlike both foundationalism and infinitism, interdependence denies that the grounding relation is asymmetric. Thus, (strong) metaphysical interdependence says that reality is ordered by relations of ground that are symmetric and non-wellfounded.

Why take this view seriously? The asymmetry of grounding is often justified on grounds of its relationship to (causal) explanation, which is said to be necessarily asymmetric. Thompson points out, though, that there are perfectly good explanatory models on which explanations are not symmetric; that the analogy with causal explanation may be no good; and that we often make appeal to symmetric explanations where explanations, say, involve identities. Not to mention, thinks Thompson, that the asymmetry of explanation is desirable for epistemic, rather than metaphysical, reasons. In addition to this, metaphysical interdependence may do a better job of accounting for competing intuitions regarding the relationship between parts and wholes, the possibilities of gunk and junk, and the problem of how to ground grounding.

Jacek Brzozowski offers an interesting discussion of the relationship between priority monism (the thesis according to which the whole cosmos is prior to its parts) and gunk (mereological orderings in which there are no bottom elements). The possibility of gunk, we are told, spells a problem for priority pluralism -- the thesis according to which the parts of the cosmos are prior to the whole cosmos -- and not priority monism; and, therewith, furnishes us with a reason to favour the latter. Neither of these claims, argues Brzozowski, are true.

Let us suppose that the whole cosmos is what is fundamental and that this is all and only that which is required to generate everything else. As what is fundamental needs to provide an adequate supervenience base for the derivative, the cosmos must be an adequate supervenience base for the gunky mereological structure. One way the cosmos might do this is if it instantiates some kind of distributional property. Brzozowski goes on to explore a variety of different ways this property could be, and how it could account for gunk, and concludes that none of them result in monism being better poised to cope with such a possibility than pluralism. Even if Brzozowski is ultimately incorrect in his evaluation of the situation, this paper fills an unfortunate lacuna in the literature. How anything fundamental would have to be such that it can give rise to absolutely everything else is an interesting and poorly explored question.

In 'What are Dispositional Properties?', Matthew Tugby is interested in which account of dispositionalism ought to be preferred: dispositional realism or causal nominalism. He comes down on the side of the former.

For the dispositional realist, objects instantiate sui generis properties (tropes or universals) that determine how those objects are disposed to behave: properties determine dispositions. For the causal nominalist, dispositional properties just are sets of individuals which share causal functional roles: facts about what something would do under certain conditions (subjunctive facts) fix facts about which dispositional properties that thing has (which sets of individuals it belongs to).

Whilst dispositional realism is known to have its difficulties, causal nominalism faces some fairly substantive problems of its own: causal nominalism gives rise to vicious regresses or circles; causal nominalism results in objects lacking intrinsic natures, leading to relationalism at the level of the particular; and causal nominalism is unable to explain the clustering of properties. It is the latter of these two sets of problems that Tugby believes to be particularly problematic. Dispositional realism, argues Tugby, is better equipped to provide us with the means to explain certain aspects of reality and is, therewith, the more promising way to be a dispositionalist.

Editor Mark Jago's contribution takes on a discussion of the grounding problem for pluralists about coincident objects. Take a scarf that is knitted from two different lengths of yarn that are then joined together. In spite of being coincident for their entire lives, the scarf and the lengths of yarn have different persistence conditions, different natures, and fall under different sortals. The grounding problem is the problem of how we are to account for these differences. Two developed responses have come in the forms of conceptualism and pluralism. The former Jago rejects because he thinks it implies an unacceptable picture of the history of our conceptual architecture. And the latter he rejects because the primitivist typically makes appeal to a modal plenitude principle, which is not the sort of principle, thinks Jago, that ought to be a matter of stipulation.

In their place, Jago offers what he calls an essential bundle theory. Broadly construed, 'a material object's nature is a bundle (a mereological sum) of properties, and an object is identified with its nature' (where a thing's nature is its essence) (p.114). Importantly, these bundles do not include modal or sortal property instances. What grounds the different persistence conditions of our scarf and the yarn that it is fashioned from are the essences (property bundles) of the items falling under the respective sortals. On this account, sortal differences, and differences in persistence conditions, are explained by differences in essences: sortal difference and differences in persistence conditions are grounded in the natures of the objects that exhibit them.

Nicholas K. Jones develops a novel account of object according to which it is a determinable. Let us suppose that to have a determinable is just to have a determination of that determinable. If object is a determinable, then anything that has that determinable must have some determination or other thereof. Let us also suppose that a kind is a complete determination (a determination that is not itself a determinable) of the determinable object. To be an object, then, is just to be some kind or other of object: a dog, a spoon, etc.

Understanding objects in this way has a number of advantages, thinks Jones. First of all, it allows us to explain, in the way that Quine thought impossible, why it is that some properties and not others are necessary to an object, and why different properties are necessary to different objects. In other words, this way of understanding objecthood allows us to better understand de re possibility. Second, and perhaps better still, this way of understanding objecthood may also allow us to make sense of the (notoriously problematic) non-modal notion of essence as advanced in the works of Aristotle and Fine.

In her contribution, Sonia Roca-Royes considers a problem for origin essentialism. It seems intuitively plausible that had the table at which I am now writing been constructed from ever so slightly different parts, it would still be the table that it is. Let's call this view, flexible Essentiality of Material Origins for Artefacts or flexible-(EMOA). This is to be contrasted with inflexible-(EMOA), whereby material origins are not flexible. And yet, argues Roca-Royes, theories that endorse flexible-(EMOA) appear to do so at the cost of other very intuitive and plausible metaphysical assumptions that are worth preserving. More specifically, she is concerned with how this conflict plays itself out in the accounts of Salmon and Williamson.

Consider the following five plausible theses:

(1) Flexible-(EMOA)
(2) The accessibility relation among worlds is transitive
(3) There are no coincident artefacts of the same kind, fully sharing their spatio-temporal regions
(4) There are sufficient conditions for the existence of artefacts
(5) If P is the individual essence of an artefact, then all properties analogous to P are individual essences of artefacts too.

Although (1)-(5) are jointly incompatible, all five are desirable. Roca-Royes argues that Williamson's account is superior as it rejects only (3); in contrast to Salmon's account which rejects all save (1) and (3). In spite of this, she believes the preservation of (3) to be so important as to justify a reconsideration of (1). As some kind of essentiality about the origins of material objects seems more intuitive than rejecting the essentiality of origins altogether, it is inflexible-(EMOA) that bears further contemplation. Roca-Royes argues that an account of the essentiality of the origins of material artefacts that is inflexible accommodates four of the five aforementioned theses and is, thus, the better account.

In the final piece, Nathan Wildman discusses three modalist responses to Fine's challenge to modal accounts of essence. Although he -- Wildman -- argues that these three responses do not work, he believes that we need not abandon the quest to develop a modal account of essence.

Recall the Finean Challenge. A natural way of defining what it is to be essential is as follows: Φ is essential to x iffdf necessarily, if x exists, then x has Φ. The problem is that essentialism so formulated delivers us a number of troubling counterexamples: being such that there are infinitely many prime numbers and being distinct from the Eiffel Tower are both essential to Socrates. Michael Della Rocca, Edward Zalta and Michael Gorman have each offered, in some cases quite sophisticated, accounts as a means of circumventing these sorts of counterexamples. Wildman carries out a detailed exploration of each of these attempts and concludes that whilst none of them are ultimately successful, they teach us a lot about how we ought to go about developing a successful modal account of essences. In particular, a view he calls sparse modalism takes these lessons to heart and may well be just the kind of account the modalist is looking for. Wildman's lucid and patient discussion will surely be of interest to many.

All told, the papers in this volume are substantive and, in many cases, compelling. Although something of a motley assemblage, Reality Making offers something of value to anyone with an interest in grounding, fundamentality and essentialism.