Realizing Reason: A Narrative of Truth and Knowing

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Danielle Macbeth, Realizing Reason: A Narrative of Truth and Knowing, Oxford University Press, 2014, 494 pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198704751.

Reviewed by Catherine Legg, University of Waikato


This substantial book is a highly original and thorough work of synthetic first philosophy. Although it has some recognizable roots in the Kantian/Sellarsian tradition of the Pittsburgh school, it adds a wealth of precise discussion of examples from science and mathematics, made possible by Danielle Macbeth's dual training in arts and sciences. It presents a developmental story of human reason boot-strapping itself towards greater power and clarity through the Western tradition (which is the sole purview of the discussion). This development is divided into three distinct stages, which might be summarized very roughly as knowledge of: i) Objects, ii) Concepts applied to Objects and iii) Concepts alone. A fuller explication of these stages now follows.

i) For the Ancient Greeks, inspired by the first truly rigorous geometrical proofs, knowledge consisted in perception's ability to "grasp an object as what it is". But this framework was limited in its account of the relations in which objects stand and struggled to distinguish between what an object is and what it is like.

ii) In early modernity the Scientific Revolution did its work at least partly due to Descartes' achievements in algebra, which were scaffolded by ideals of reason which enabled a "radically new understanding of inanimate nature in terms of exceptionless physical laws governing the motions of matter" (p. 5). At the same time, the ancients' "immediacy of perception" was supplanted by a new "intentional directedness on reality" which is "inherently mediated, as constitutively involving both the will and (mental) representations . . . that are judged to be true through acts of will." (p. 13). Thereby modern thought flowered into Kant's theory of judgment which pairs objects given in intuition with concepts. This epistemology enabled a new self-consciousness about the power of knowing which is not possible when the mind merely focuses on objects, but for Kant this is only fully realized in the realm of the transcendentally ideal. Moreover, in the very creation of its realm of 'mental representations', this epistemology sunders our rationality from the 'things as they are' that they purport to represent, thereby delivering the famed 'sideways-on' view of reality in which we ultimately only infer the existence and nature of things in themselves.

iii) Finally in the 19th century a revolution took place in mathematics (constituting "a second birth of the subject", p. 220), whereby fundamental concepts such as function and continuity were for the first time rigorously defined and a new mathematical language developed "within which to reason deductively to conclusions [about those concepts] which are ampliative in Kant's sense" (p. 7). This brought into being a new form of knowing which apprehends relations between concepts alone and thereby constitutes a literal 'realizing of reason', which is emblematized in the passage from natural to mathematical language. From this insight Macbeth draws conclusions wider even than the epistemological: she aims to "develop and defend a new conception of our being in the world, one that at once builds on and transforms the now standard conception . . . according to which our experience of reality is the result of . . . merely causal impacts on our sense organs" (p. 7). The overall goal is thus, profoundly, to rehabilitate an ancient view of ourselves as rational animals, suitably transformed by the insights of modernity which for a period eclipsed that view:

It is because nothing is Given, because the spontaneity of thought is radically unconditioned . . . that we can make sense of the idea that in our scientific investigations we are after, and in time can achieve, knowledge of things as they are, the same for all rational beings (p. 10).

Macbeth sees the potentialities of this new form of knowing illustrated most clearly in Frege's logic, which he developed precisely as an arena for systematizing the new mathematical thinking. Frege's true aim and achievement in his Begriffsschrift has yet to be grasped, she argues, since the philosophical revolution made possible by the third mathematical revolution has yet to arrive: philosophy remains fundamentally Kantian:

Mathematical logic, and the model-theoretic and quantificational conception of language to which it gives rise, are utterly and strangely irrelevant to mathematics as it is actually practiced . . . .The problem is not the rules of inference. The problem is the way those rules, and language as a whole, are understood (p. 152).

For this reason, much of the book turns around how Macbeth thinks mathematical rules and language should be understood, offering rich discussions of written systems of signs through the history of mathematics in which the reasoning is not merely described but specific detailed examples show how it actually works.

The book is divided into three large overall sections, corresponding to the posited epistemological epochs: Perception, Understanding and Reason, and each is further divided into three chapters.


This section's first chapter, "Where We Begin", offers an overview of human evolution from the biological through to the cultural and linguistic, and an initial critique of what is claimed to be still our standard Cartesian-Kantian view of human life as consisting in "norms inside", and "causes outside". Robert Brandom is here an explicit target for critiquing modernity's Humeanism yet remaining trapped in Kantianism.

The book's main argument now begins with a discussion of "Ancient Greek Diagrammatic Practice". It offers an extended and subtle discussion of Euclidean methods, with examples. Euclid's proofs, it is argued, should not be understood as an axiomatic system in today's sense but as something closer to natural deduction. Following the new wave of readings of ancient mathematical texts seen in for instance Reviel Netz and Clemency Montelle, Macbeth emphasizes Euclid's proofs as recipes for actual construction on the page. (In fact the solution of construction problems is what constitutes ancient mathematical knowledge, it is claimed, p. 72). In this way, Euclid offers more than merely "picture proofs". The discussion draws two further key distinctions: between merely describing reasoning and displaying it, and between reasoning in a diagram and reasoning on the basis of a diagram.

An important issue with respect to mathematical diagrams is their generality and the risk of taking to be universal what is merely a property of the instance (e.g. a given triangle's being scalene). Macbeth attempts to resolve this using Grice's distinction between 'natural meaning', which he imagines to be purely causal, and 'non-natural' meaning, which derives from language-users' intentions. A proof made on a diagram of a scalene triangle can be a proof about all triangles insofar as mathematicians intend it so. But this move seems to rob the structure of the diagram of its role in the proof. Macbeth therefore mixes in some ideas from Peirce's semiotics, describing the scalene diagram as "a Peircean icon with non-natural meaning". But these two philosophers fit ill together (e.g. for Peirce 'natural' is not the opposite of intentional, nor can any scientific meaning be purely causal). Arguably a more thorough Peircean semiotic analysis would have been better. In conclusion, Macbeth observes that ancient Greek mathematics is "an inquiry about a domain of objects". But Plato and Aristotle famously disagreed about the nature of these objects and their relationship to the sensory world. Macbeth argues that both philosophers were capturing important aspects of mathematics which couldn't be reconciled until much later: mathematical truth is Platonic and mathematical knowledge is Aristotelian (p. 104).

The third chapter, "A New World Order", advances to the cusp of modernity. Elementary algebra made great strides in translating geometrical shapes into algebraic formulae. But what the objects are in this new relational language is not easy to discern, and in order to make the most of its possibilities mathematicians had to learn to think in a new way. Macbeth argues that Descartes took a major leap here in an interesting comparison with his immediate predecessor François Viète, whose "Analytical Art" developed many of the tools of modern algebra (such as distinguishing the known and unknown parameters of a problem with different sorts of letters) but remained "pre-modern" in presenting a set of calculating tools with no overarching interpretation rather than a mathematical language proper (p. 126). As an instructive contrast, Descartes' geometry is discussed in detail. The section ends with Descartes creating the decisive split between "an inner realm of meanings, and an outer realm of brute physical causality" (p. 151), although he himself qua mathematician was already anticipating the third stage of human knowing where the concepts of mathematics are "stripped of all the sensory content that first attaches to them" (p. 140).


The second section of the book dives straight into Kant's critical turn. Cartesian dualism suggests that human thought and judgment cannot possibly answer to what is as it is (namely pure primary qualities), so Kant feels compelled to posit transcendental ideality. Now "Not reason but only understanding is a power of judgment, of knowing" (p. 151). Kant does go beyond Hume in splitting the distinction between relations of ideas and matters of fact in two -- a priori and a posteriori, and analytic and synthetic -- and recognizing that not only do we have synthetic a priori knowledge, but also that explaining how this is possible is one of the most urgent problems of philosophy.

It is argued that Kant's answer to the problem essentially involves an analysis of construction across three levels of articulation in systems of signs: "primitive parts, wholes of those parts, and wholes of the intermediate wholes" (p. 162). It is in rearranging the intermediate wholes into previously unanticipated further wholes that deductive reasoning can be ampliative. But for Kant this construction is still taking place in intuition (in the case of mathematics -- pure intuition). So the chapter then addresses Kant's distinction between concepts and intuitions in his Transcendental Logic, suggesting that the distinction essentially holds between the mediate and general and the immediate and singular (p. 169). This duality in our thinking is the source of our ability to distinguish between the possible and the actual (p. 171) and to display "what is a sufficient ground for a judgment without asserting either the ground or the judgment" (p. 185). This last feature allows our judgements to be not merely changed but corrected -- a vital step towards a mature power of knowing. But Kant remains saddled with a transcendental logic coupled with a dependence of knowing on "something given in sensibility" (p. 201).

Thus the next chapter ("Mathematics Transformed, Again") returns to the mathematical sphere for the next great step forward. 19th century mathematics famously turned against constructions and intuition and rebuilt itself anew beginning with Bolzano's purely conceptual proof of the intermediate value theorem in 1817. Non-Euclidean geometries were an important motivator for this, and the reworking of limits of infinite series (without infinitesimal objects) formed an important step along the way. As Reimann wrote, crucially, "proving is no longer a matter of transforming terms in accordance with rules but a process of logical deduction from concepts" (p. 217). The end-result is a new form of mathematical practice which, it is claimed, "relies not at all on any form of representation" (p. 212).

Chapter 6 ("Mathematics and Language") draws out implications of these insights for current mathematical logic which are highly challenging. Mathematical logic understands mathematical proof as a deductive chain of reasoning which is as far as possible gap-free. But in fact such a chain is not necessary or sufficient for proof in mathematics. It is not necessary because working mathematicians often leave large sections of their working undescribed (as 'obvious'). It is not sufficient as rendering any significant proof gap-free often lengthens it to the point of incomprehensibility. Proofs are not meant to convey deductive entailment so much as understanding. Thus the mathematical logicians' formalizations are no use in actual mathematical practice.

But Macbeth goes further still in her critique of mathematical logic. Our current logic remains Kantian in being merely formal, bracketed from all semantic content (in that an argument's validity lies solely in 'logical terms' such as 'and' and 'not'). Yet "particular contents do seem to matter in mathematical reasoning" (p. 285). In other words: "a mathematician's proof depends on an understanding and prior assimilation of the meaning of certain concepts from which certain properties follow logically" (p. 284). Kantian formalism with respect to logic also leads us to believe that generalization must be understood "in terms of . . . quantifying over a domain of objects" (p. 249). Yet the failure of Frege's logicism showed that the objects of mathematics cannot be purely logical, it is argued, and this leads the Kantian either on a fruitless search for other objects (which Paul Benacerraf and other philosophers of mathematics have highlighted the dim prospects for) or into an arid formalism. These conclusions seem intriguing and pregnant with possibility.


The third section begins by noting that we are now concerned with our capacity "for knowledge of things as they are in themselves", which will be explicated in terms of intelligible unity (namely, "a whole of independently intelligible parts that is nonetheless not reducible to its parts", p. 296). The key figure Macbeth wishes to guide us down this path is of course Frege, in her distinctive reading of him. Thus the first chapter, "Reasoning in Frege's Begriffsschrift" lays out that system in detail. It is noted that it is meant to serve as both Leibnizean characteristic universalis and calculus ratocinator, and its issues with Basic Law V are sidestepped by suggesting that Russell's Paradox really showed that "There are no logical objects but only logical concepts" (p. 299).

The best way to understand the functioning of the 'concept script', it is argued, does not lie in studying Frege's derivations of theorems from axioms in Part II but his derivation of theorem 133 from further definitions in Part III. (Theorem 133 says that if f is a single-valued function and y and m both follow x in the f-sequence, then either m follows y or y belongs to the f-sequences beginning with m.) In many ways this is the crux of the book. The proof embodies the three-level interplay of "primitive parts, wholes of those parts, and wholes of the intermediate wholes" in order to produce ampliative deductive inference discussed earlier. The underlying structure of relevant definitions is indicated on p. 327 in a complex tree diagram of inter-related theorems about 30 deep.

The ideas are intriguing, but being able to follow this proof is not for a one or even two-time reader of the book. It would require a course of specific study, as Macbeth acknowledges ("it takes real work and devoted practice with the language to come to be in a position readily to see in the system of signs the ideas that are in play in the proof", p. 362). Thus as a scaffold for a quantum leap in epistemic functioning (or, as Macbeth puts it, "power of knowing") it perhaps leaves something to be desired. One cannot help wondering whether the notational experimentation of another 19th century logician who was in hot pursuit of ampliative deductive reasoning -- the Existential Graphs of Charles Peirce -- would have been any easier to grapple with. But perhaps Peirce's Graphs remain too Kantian by Macbeth's lights; it would have been good to have a discussion of this. (There is some discussion of Peirce's notion of so-called theorematic deduction in the next chapter, and it is claimed that only Frege managed to develop a mathematical language to show how this was possible.)

The second chapter, "Truth and Knowledge in Mathematics", outlines how we can now understand mathematical knowledge as fallible, which is necessary in order to move beyond the Kantian dualism between corrigible empirical knowledge and intuitive mathematical knowledge to a fully corrigible, fully conceptual knowledge. ("Because it makes everything maximally explicit and hence available to critically reflective scrutiny and criticism, the method gives one cognitive control over the domain of inquiry", p. 381). This new understanding of mathematical objectivity (without 'objects') is however linked back to Aristotle's classical model of science as a structure of proof with a minimum of primitive laws, newly interpreted (pp. 373-4). It is also noted that Frege's further logical move beyond Kant involved breaking the Kantian distinction between concepts (spontaneity) and intuitions (receptivity) into two further distinctions: concept and object, and Sinn and Bedeutung:

Whereas for Kant all cognitive significance . . . is through concepts, and all objectivity, all truth, lies in relation to an object or objects . . . Frege requires us to distinguish, on the one hand, between cognitive significance (Fregean sense, Sinn) and concepts, which are the Bedeutung of concept words, and on the other, between objective significance (Bedeutung) and objects. (p. 402)

At this point, one might worry that although a plausible case has been made that mathematical knowledge can be conceived of as lacking objects, mathematics is a notoriously unique and special case amongst the sciences. Could these insights be extended to what we generally think of as the empirical sciences and if so, how? In the final chapter, "The View from Here", Macbeth makes an intriguing beginning on this question with physics, suggesting that "Einstein was engaged in a new practice of physics" that "provides a mathematical account of the structure of the whole of space-time" (p. 433), in contrast with (still) early-modern conceptions of the natural sciences as engaged in discovering new kinds of particles or forces to move them. But of course much more could be said on this.


This fascinating book contains many rich and original insights. To my mind it does raise many further questions. Are the three stages of knowing really as discrete as they are made out to be and logically articulated in the way Macbeth imagines? Is any further epistemic development in store for us, or is this the final stage? How does this account of the new power of knowing compare with other conceptions of 'Reason realizing itself', such as that of Hegel, who also claimed to be transcending Kant's concept-intuition distinction? (If Hegel fails, why does he?)

Macbeth's key theses also seem to be in tension with a number of 20th century philosophical movements which suggest that human reason can never be so transparent to itself, or achieve such total cognitive control of its subject matter, as the book suggests. What of the later Wittgenstein's idea that the extension of rules -- including mathematical rules -- is not determined in the mind of any individual knower but across rule-following communities, and that in some unfamiliar situations the extensions of our familiar rules may simply be indeterminate (in famous defiance of Frege's demand that all concepts have sharp boundaries)? The pragmatist tradition offers some further, though not unrelated, challenges to the thrust of this book. For instance it suggests that our beliefs should be understood as habits, which include bodily accommodations to our environment and its affordances which it might not be possible to render explicit (propositionally, logically). Pragmatism also teaches that the world of experience will always offer to our minds baffling surprises that are non-conceptual and in that sense objectual (what Peirce called Secondness). These considerations would seem to suggest that we must always remain to some degree epistemically opaque to ourselves and fail to fully grasp our own concepts. Thus, rather than a new post-Kantian stage in human cognition, might Macbeth's praise of the Begriffsschrift not rather constitute a retreat to a kind of hyper-Cartesianism? Perhaps Macbeth would embrace this, suggesting merely that Descartes did not fully work out the implications of his mathematics for his philosophy.

This is a long book with many very large and very general themes in play and as such it is a demanding read. Nevertheless, as a scholar with strong interests in logic, philosophy of mathematics and 19th Century thought, I found reading it extremely worthwhile.