Reason and Analysis in Ancient Greek Philosophy: Essays in Honor of David Keyt

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Georgios Anagnostopoulos and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.), Reason and Analysis in Ancient Greek Philosophy: Essays in Honor of David Keyt, Springer, 2013, 329pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400760035.

Reviewed by Øyvind Rabbås, University of Oslo


David Keyt has been an influential contributor to the field of ancient philosophy for the past fifty years, and the present volume is a tribute to his work from a group of his students, colleagues, and friends. It consists of an editorial introduction, a memoir by Keyt of his academic career, and fifteen other chapters. These are in three groups of five, on Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle. They all, in some way or other, "explore the central role of the concept of reason in metaphysics, moral psychology, epistemology, ethics, and political philosophy." (3)

Keyt's autobiographical sketch, "A Life in the Academy", recounts his own career from the time when he was a student to the present. The story is written with a rather wry sense of humour, and gives an interesting and at times fascinating glimpse both of Keyt's personal life and the development of American academia during this period.

Thomas C. Brickhouse and Nicholas D. Smith address the topic of Socrates' so-called 'intellectualism,' the claim that "all voluntary human behaviour follows from an intellectual (. . . [or] cognitive) state or feature of the agent" (45). Brickhouse and Smith agree that Socrates holds this view, but deny what (they claim) all others take to be implied by this, viz. that there is "no place in the explanation of human action for psychological potentials other than purely cognitive ones" (46). This is because, even if people, on each occasion, do what they believe is best, what they believe is often caused by their appetites and passions. Thus, while the appetites and passions do not directly cause action, they can do so indirectly. Socrates uses this insight in part to explain how people behave, and in part to motivate his own way of testing, exhorting, and shaming people into improving their ways. The authors substantiate these claims by citing four passages in the Apology.

The next three chapters relate to Socrates' personal political conduct. Jean Roberts takes up the seeming inconsistency between Socrates' general principle never to do anything unjust and his view, expressed through the voice of the laws of Athens, "to obey or persuade", i.e., either to obey the laws and the legal institutions, or to persuade them through argument that they are wrong and that they should thus recant their decision. Roberts argues that there is no inconsistency here, since "The absolute legal obligation is nested in, and qualified by, the broader moral obligation to avoid injustice, which is defined independently of the law" (65). The only way Socrates could escape from his punishment would therefore be if he would otherwise commit an injustice, but that is not the case: all he would do would be to suffer injustice, not commit it. Therefore he should stay and accept his punishment. We should note what seems implied rather than explicitly stated by Roberts: that the justification for the principle of obedience seems to be that it follows from the broader moral obligation to avoid injustice, since living in a community and abiding by its laws is an important way of living justly.

Stephen M. Gardiner argues that there is a paradox involved in the way Socrates is presented in the Platonic dialogues: "How could Socrates the man be so impressive in his main political acts and yet so misguided (even naïve) as a political theorist?" (67) After rejecting extant interpretations as wanting, Gardiner presents his own "accommodationist" view. His  key claim is that "Socrates' fundamental political concern is with the very possibility of a good, well-functioning society that is responsive to both reasons and the well-being of its citizens." (67; cf. 87f) But because he is deeply pessimistic about the prospects for such a society, there is no practical way for him to implement his theoretical views in his own personal life.

In chapter 6, Merrill Ring claims to have found a devastating flaw in Socrates' central argument in the Crito for not escaping. Ring first identifies two principles Socrates uses to justify that conclusion: (1) "one ought to keep one's agreements" and (2) "retaliation is wrong" (91, 93). Ring concentrates on (2) and claims that Socrates' argument from this principle to the conclusion that escape would be wrong fails both because the principle itself turns out to be unsupported, and because escape cannot plausibly be seen as an act of retaliation. The main interest in Ring's reading, for me, is the way he distinguishes between the two principles (1) and (2) and concentrates on (2).

In the final chapter on Socrates, Nils Ch. Rauhut provocatively asks "How Virtuous Was Socrates?" The answer is: not completely, for he was constantly having to struggle with his immense sexual desire. The crucial piece of evidence for this claim is Alcibiades' speech in the Symposium. According to Rauhut, Alcibiades is a brilliant and intelligent person who portrays Socrates as a person seriously deluded by himself. He takes himself to be above the passions and lusts of love and to care nothing for "physical appearance and social standing", but at the same time he "spends his whole life in the company of beautiful, gifted, and rich young men" (118). Alcibiades' masterful irony succeeds in bringing this out, and this is what makes his speech funny. Thus, "Socrates emerges not as an otherworldly saint who has acquired all the cardinal virtues but rather as a human who tries to come to terms with his erotic desires." (109)

The next five chapters are devoted to Plato. Allan Silverman takes up the issue of division of labour in Kallipolis. He focuses on two questions: how are we to understand the principle of specialization, that each person should do what he is suited for, and what is the purpose of the educational institutions in the ideal city? Silverman argues that the principle of specialization should be taken rather loosely, i.e., so as not to imply any thesis to the effect that the place where each person ends up is predetermined by his nature but, rather, is "a function of the choices exercised throughout the course of an educational cursus whose initial class is everybody." (143) Further,

the aim and nature of the state [and its educational institutions] is neither the stability of the state nor the (re)creation of a limited number of philosopher-rulers, but rather the moral betterment of the greatest number of citizens, that is, the happiness of all the citizenry. (126)

C.D.C. Reeve takes on the problem of understanding the tripartite soul in the Republic. The crucial problem, he claims, is "explaining what these soul-parts are and how they are related to the soul itself and to the person whose soul it is." (146) Reeve begins by reviewing the various aspects and properties of the three parts. It turns out, Reeve argues (150-52), that only the rational part can achieve the status of "a soul" or "a person". The other soul-parts are somehow accretions to the rational part, i.e., the person, and they are so only in the sublunary world of embodied human beings. In a final section he finds this view confirmed in other dialogues: Phaedo, Phaedrus, and Timaeus.

In the next chapter Gerasimos Santas examines the analogy between city and soul in the Republic. Santas focuses on two questions: "[1] whether the parts of the soul are faculties or agents and [2] whether all the citizens or only the philosophers in Plato's ideal city can be just." (172) His answers are, briefly: (1) the parts of the soul are faculties, and (2) all the citizens can be just. Therefore, he concludes, Plato should not be taken to advocate ethical elitism (172). The answer to (1) entails, or at least makes plausible, the answer to (2), and the answer to (2) amounts to a kind of non-elitism. While the parts of the soul are defined in terms of their functions, they may each perform their function well or badly. And people may be ruled by reason (the faculty) even if they don't have wisdom (the virtue of reason). In a well-organized society such as Kallipolis, the educational institutions will see to it that reason rules in each citizen's soul, even though only a few of them are wise.

In chapter 11, Mark L. McPherran asks: What are we to make of the Myth of Er that concludes the Republic in Book X? Plato has aimed his argument at the person faced with the choice of life -- the just or the unjust life -- on the presupposition that this choice is the responsibility of that person alone. However, in the myth, he seems to reduce that choice to all sorts of contingencies for which the individual is not responsible. Doesn't this undermine the force of the argument in the body of the work? According to McPherran there is indeed a tension here that is ultimately irresolvable -- which seems to make the Republic as well an aporetic dialogue.

In the final paper on Plato, Christopher Shields discusses the puzzling claim in the Sophist that "Logos comes to be for us because of the interweaving of Forms with one another." (259e5-6; quoted at 214) Shields rejects the semantic account according to which the forms are meanings, for if they were, a whole class of logoi (sentences, statements, propositions, whether spoken or just thought) would be meaningless, including Plato's own prime illustration of the claim, viz. "Theaetetus flies", which contains only one form (216). Shields, drawing on John Ackrill and Jerrold Katz, proposes that, on Plato's view, the forms are not simply meanings; rather, they are items in a deeper metaphysical structure reflected in logoi composed of linguistic expressions with meanings. Secondly, the interweaving of forms is not something that we do, or bring about, as we compose our logoi; rather, the forms are already interwoven before we can even get started composing our logoi, and this interweaving is the condition of possibility for logoi. This, finally, amounts to an argument for the existence of the forms.

The final third of the volume is devoted to Aristotle. In chapter 13, S. Marc Cohen considers a peculiar element in Aristotle's ontology, the so-called accidental beings (such as the pale horse or seated Socrates), found both in the Categories and in the Metaphysics. In his ontological schema Aristotle distinguishes between substances, such as a horse or a man, and accidents, such as pallor and being seated. But then he adds a third, intermediate item, the accidental being. Against the two main lines of interpretation Cohen argues that accidental beings play a mediating role in Aristotle's ontology. Accidents depend on substances, and universals depend on particulars. Hence particulars in the non-substantial categories have a dual nature: they are particulars in their category, but accidents of their substance. Thus, the pale horse is a particular, viz. pallor's being instantiated in a horse. Since this is restricted in time -- it comes to be when the horse becomes pale (in this case, presumably, at birth) and it ceases to exist when the horse ceases to be pale (at death) -- accidental beings resemble events.

Accidental beings appear in chapter 14 as well, albeit negatively. Here Frank A. Lewis discusses Metaphysics Zeta 6 and the problem of determining which kinds of thing have an essence. Aristotle's considered view is exclusive: "only those things that are suitably primary can have an essence", although he sometimes holds an inclusive view and grants essences to certain other things as well (243). The argument of Zeta 6 is intricate and proceeds in two stages. One of the complexities of this argument is that Aristotle uses Platonic forms as an example of such primary entities. But although Aristotle does not accept the existence of the forms, these forms play the role of primary entity within Plato's ontology, and as such Aristotle and Plato are on the same side when it comes to the identification of ontologically primary entities with their essences.

Cass Weller moves to Zeta 11 and the question of functionalism. He asks whether Aristotle's hylomorphism can be understood as involving "compositional plasticity". This is the view that human beings are defined exclusively in terms of their functions, i.e., the capacities to do what humans characteristically do, but this leaves open that they might be made (composed) of materials other than flesh and bone. Although there is a passage in Zeta 11 that might be taken to imply compositional plasticity, and has been so taken, Weller argues against it. Aristotle grants that artefacts such as spheres may be, and are, "realized" any several kinds of material, e.g. bronze, wood, stone. However, humans are only encountered in flesh and bone, which raises the question whether a reference to matter should be included in the definition of the form of human beings. Weller argues that the answer Aristotle gives is 'no'. The definition of man is functional, referring to the capacities to do what humans characteristically do. But since this essentially includes movement and change, the definition of man must, at some level of generality, specify "sensible material parts fitly disposed to support these characteristic ways of acting and being acted on" (279).

In chapter 16, Miller surveys Aristotle's theory of belief and its relation to his view of knowledge. Although Aristotle's terminology varies (see the useful review at 305f), there is a system in his discussions. Aristotle's account starts from the concept of judgment as a combination of thoughts. A judgment is true if it somehow represents the facts correctly. Knowledge "is a judgment corresponding to a universal and necessary combination", while "belief is a judgment corresponding to a combination which is not both universal and necessary." (290) Moreover, knowledge, as opposed to belief, must be demonstrated and involve awareness of the essence of what the judgment is about. Finally, Aristotle adheres to "teleological approximism": "Knowledge of the truth is a natural end of human beings (cf. Met A.1 980a21). If we cannot achieve knowledge, the closest we can come is to true belief, and we are most likely to believe truly if our beliefs are in agreement with beliefs that are reputable." (299)

In the final chapter, Charles M. Young discusses Aristotle's notion of grace (charis), as expressed at EN V 5, 1132b33-1133a5). Young understands this as "the natural force that takes the good that we do to and for one another and returns, magnifies, and ramifies it." (311) Such grace is related to gratitude (which is also generally used to translate charis), but not identical with it: while gratitude "involves the acknowledgement of good received", grace "involves the return of good for good received." (312-13) Aristotle's discussion of grace and gratitude occurs in his discussion of "reciprocal justice". Such justice, which occurs in exchange of goods in society, is what maintains the political community (polis) (see V 5, 1132b33-34). As Young takes this, grace thus tends to lead people into an appealing "gracious regress" where one favour generates another in return, which then generates a further one, and so on ad infinitum (315). Thus, grace is fundamental to human community.

The papers cover a wide range of topics in Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle. Inevitably I found some of them more interesting and persuasive than others, but the volume as a whole is well worth reading. Many, if not most, of them approach the texts as philosophical texts, applying analytical tools in order to understand and criticize them and show their contemporary relevance. In this respect, too, the volume constitutes a worthy and fitting tribute to David Keyt.