Reason and Faith: Themes from Richard Swinburne

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Michael Bergmann and Jeffrey E. Brower (eds.), Reason and Faith: Themes from Richard Swinburne, Oxford University Press, 2016, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732648.

Reviewed by Max Baker-Hytch, Wycliffe Hall, Oxford University


This festschrift in honour of Richard Swinburne consists of ten essays, assembled and briefly introduced by Michael Bergmann and Jeffrey E. Brower. It is the fruit of a conference which celebrated Swinburne's prolific philosophical career and which took place at Purdue University in 2014, the year of Swinburne's eightieth birthday. The conference was organized by the editors and each of the papers delivered there has made its way, presumably after some revisions, into the volume.

Alongside Alvin Plantinga, Swinburne, it is fair to say, has been one of the most influential analytic philosophers of religion in the last forty years. His work is voluminous and spans an incredible breadth of topics. He has written more than twenty books and over two hundred articles (several of which have been translated into multiple languages) on everything from natural theological arguments, the problem of evil, the divine attributes and specifically Christian doctrines through to the mind-body problem, free will, miracles and the laws of nature, and the epistemology of religious belief. Especially noteworthy is his pioneering use of Bayesian probability theory to formulate novel versions of various natural theological arguments in his The Existence of God and The Resurrection of God Incarnate. Indeed, the now widespread use of Bayes' theorem by contemporary analytic philosophers of religion -- as evidenced by such volumes as the recent Probability in the Philosophy of Religion -- owes much to Swinburne's groundbreaking work.

This volume, then, is a fitting tribute to a remarkable intellectual career. It largely succeeds in its stated aim of drawing out some of the key themes in Swinburne's work. The book is divided into two parts, the first covering natural theology, which is further subdivided into sections on faith, theistic arguments, and divine power. The second covers philosophical theology, and is subdivided into sections on atonement and liturgy, and immortality, the body, and soul. These divisions seem slightly artificial to me as it isn't really clear, for example, why the two essays on the nature of faith fit better under the heading of 'natural theology' than under 'philosophical theology'. In any case, the essays are of the high standard one would expect from philosophers of this calibre and, with a couple of notable omissions, the list of contributors is a roster of the great and the good of contemporary analytic philosophy of religion.

I was somewhat disappointed to find that the editors didn't include an introductory essay but instead only a very brief preface. An introductory essay would have helped to further unify the book -- something it needed, given the rather diverse array of topics covered. The common thread that was supposed to draw together the various contributions, I take it, was that they addressed aspects of Swinburne's work. Unfortunately, however, not all of them do this. Although fine essays in their own right, the contributions from Nicholas Wolterstorff and Peter van Inwagen don't mention Swinburne's writings nor do they address topics on which he has specifically written. It also struck me that the entirely North American provenance of the contributors somewhat obscures the fact that Swinburne's work has also had a very considerable influence on philosophers of religion working on the other side of the Atlantic, not least in Swinburne's native United Kingdom. These criticisms should be taken as rather minor, however, and they don't detract from my overall impression that this collection contains some fine pieces of philosophical writing and would constitute an excellent resource for a newcomer to the philosophy of religion wanting to get a flavour of the current state of play in the field from some of its leading practitioners. My aim in the remainder of this review is a modest one: to offer brief summaries of the essays which convey something of the spirit of each of them.

The first part begins with Jonathan L. Kvanvig's essay on the nature of faith. In keeping with an approach that is becoming more common in the philosophical literature on faith, Kvanvig rejects cognitivist approaches according to which faith is merely some species of propositional attitude. Still, a tendency in that literature has been to focus almost exclusively on faith that such-and-such is the case, rather on faith in someone or something. To his credit, Kvanvig recognizes that the latter phenomenon is the more interesting one, especially when religious faith is at issue. He considers a popular account according to which faith-in is ultimately a kind of trust in a person or thing, but finds it wanting on the grounds that trust in a person can be entirely passive, whereas Kvanvig takes it that paradigm instances of faith -- Abraham's faith in God being one that Kvanvig spends much time discussing -- seem essentially to involve a pattern of activity in pursuit of some goal. In the final analysis, then, faith-in is a commitment to strive for some goal or ideal, a commitment which is prompted by an affective response to its object and which may or may not involve propositional attitudes.

Kvanvig's essay is aptly complemented by J.L. Schellenberg's, which follows it. Schellenberg argues along similar lines that propositional attitudes are not what is most central to religious faith, but rather, that religious faith 'is fundamentally about what states of affairs are most deeply valued, and the goals and action dispositions and emotions formed in relation thereto' (p.43). He uses the fictional example of Esther, who has come to doubt Christian truth-claims but still feels emotionally compelled by the beauty of the Christian doctrine of the incarnation and allows her attitudes and goals to be shaped by her emotional response to it. Schellenberg makes a powerful case that the affections are at the heart of the phenomenon of faith, and he suggests that perhaps the only cognitive requirement for displaying religious faith is that one not positively disbelieve the creeds of the religion in question.

The subsection on natural theology comprises Paul Draper's essay on Swinburne's use of simplicity as a guide to truth and Hud Hudson's piece on fine-tuning and skeptical theism. Draper is concerned with whether Swinburne's criterion of simplicity can be derived from a more fundamental criterion for theory choice -- an important question given how crucial the criterion of simplicity is for Swinburne's assignment of a high intrinsic probability to the hypothesis of theism, and conversely, a low intrinsic probability to non-theistic hypotheses. Draper contends that Swinburne's criterion of simplicity can (more or less) be derived from what Draper regards as the more fundamental and more strongly intuitive criterion of coherence. Coherence is a matter of the extent to which the various parts of a hypothesis are inductively supported by one another; or in other words, a matter of how much genuine uniformity (as opposed to grue-like uniformity) the hypothesis attributes to the world. Draper goes on to suggest that once the criterion of simplicity is replaced with the criterion of coherence, it becomes clear that a non-theistic hypothesis which attributes brute uniformity to the world should actually be regarded as having a significantly higher intrinsic probability than Swinburne accords it.

Hudson's piece asks whether there is a version of the popular theistic argument from fine-tuning -- an argument Swinburne defends -- which is immune to the considerations about our cognitive limitations defended by skeptical theists. Following skeptical theists such as Bergmann, Hudson contends that it is 'immensely plausible' (p.68) that we are ignorant about the extent to which our grasp of moral goods and evils and the necessary connections between them is representative of the space of all possible goods and evils and of the necessary connections between them. An upshot is that we shouldn't be at all confident that it would be morally good, all things considered, for God to bring about the conditions required for the emergence of intelligent, free creatures like ourselves -- thus undermining a key premise of the fine-tuning argument. Hudson wonders whether the fine-tuning argument might circumvent this difficulty by focusing not on the alleged moral goodness of a life-permitting universe but rather on its plausibly great aesthetic value. Alas, here lies trouble too: Hudson contends that a parallel aesthetic version of skeptical theism is also very plausible.

Dean Zimmerman's essay tackles the perennial question of how to define omnipotence. Zimmerman follows Swinburne in defining omnipotence in terms of the range of states of affairs that it is within an agent's power to bring about intentionally. After working through a number of standard refinements, Zimmerman arrives at an account which closely resembles Swinburne's: roughly, X is omnipotent at a given time just in case X is a person who can bring about any logically contingent state of affairs which it is logically possible for X to intentionally bring about, given the history of the world up to that time. Such definitions face a well-known difficulty, however, having to do with the way in which a being who, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, can perform just one type of action -- say, scratching its ear -- will count as omnipotent by the above definition so long as it can perform the one action to which its essence confines it. Zimmerman considers Swinburne's proposed way of circumventing this difficulty in terms of measuring the range of states of affairs that a being can bring about, but opts for an alternative strategy which appeals to the idea that an omnipotent being is able to thwart the will of any other being.

Plantinga's essay investigates the relationship between natural laws and God. He opens with a brief survey of several prominent metaphysical accounts of natural laws, opting for something in the vicinity of David Armstrong's view that the laws of nature are necessary truths, though not absolutely (or metaphysically) necessary in the way that '1+1=2' is. So what kind of necessity do they enjoy? According to Plantinga, the answer is that they are 'creaturely inviolable' (p.132), or in other words, they are such that no matter how advanced our technology gets we will never be able to act so as to break any genuine natural law. As for how natural laws, so construed, relate to God, Plantinga goes on to build a case in favour of occasionalism, the view that the only genuine causal power in the world is God's power. In response to the worry that this makes God the author of (what we ordinarily take to be) our actions, Plantinga distinguishes between strong and weak versions of occasionalism, preferring the weak version according to which we retain causal responsibility for at least some of our mental states.

The second part of the book, devoted to philosophical theology, opens with Eleonore Stump's critique of Swinburne's account of the atonement. On that account, it is fitting for God to forgive a human sinner only if she repents and apologizes and, furthermore, makes reparation and does penance. Swinburne holds that humans have nothing to offer God as a gift of penance, so God steps in and offers the life and sacrificial death of Christ on our behalf. On the Thomistic account of love that Stump favours, love essentially involves both the desire for the good of the beloved and the desire for union with the beloved. According to Stump, forgiveness of someone who has wronged you involves your having these two desires toward the wrongdoer. This means that -- contra Swinburne -- it is possible for someone who has been wronged to forgive the wrongdoer without the wrongdoer's having to do anything at all. Stump argues, then, that Swinburne has given us an account not of forgiveness per se, but of what it takes for God to be reconciled to human beings, having already forgiven them. But she contends that it fails as an account of reconciliation since it has nothing to say about how Christ's death has the power to mend the sinful human will.

Wolterstorff's essay addresses a topic which has thus far received relatively little attentio from analytic philosophers of religion, namely, liturgy. Wolterstorff notices an interesting feature of the liturgy and hymns associated with the high holy days in the Christian calendar, wherein events such as the birth, death, and resurrection of Jesus are spoken of in the present tense and with temporal indexicals like 'now', 'today', 'tonight', and so on. How can we make sense of this 'liturgical present tense' (p.171)? Wolterstorff examines a view espoused by some twentieth century theologians, according to which the events in question are in fact 'reactualized' when the liturgy is sung -- in other words, the event token occurs again. He rightly dismisses this view as untenable, and instead develops a compelling account on which the liturgical present tense employs a sui generis linguistic trope, the 'as-if trope' (p.184), which involves acting and speaking as if the Biblical events in question really were occurring again in that moment.

The volume draws to a close with a subsection on immortality, body, and soul, comprising essays from van Inwagen and Marilyn McCord Adams. Van Inwagen's chapter is by the far the most technically demanding and certainly wouldn't be suitable reading for an undergraduate class. In it, he considers a curious argument according to which one's observation that the year of life in which one presently finds oneself is a relatively low number provides overwhelmingly strong evidence that the total number of years of one's lifespan will be relatively low, and provides infinitely strong evidence that the total number will not be infinite. Van Inwagen develops a couple of objections to this argument. One is that the crucial conditional probability on which the argument turns -- namely, the probability that one would observe that one is in one's nth year of life given that one has an infinite lifespan -- is undefined. The other is that the argument rests on a false assumption, namely, that one should 'regard the present moment as chosen at random' (p.210) from the interval between the beginning and end of one's lifespan. To the contrary, van Inwagen argues, the moment at which one considers an argument of this sort for the first time is very likely to occur within the first few decades of one's lifespan, even supposing that that lifespan is infinite.

Finally, Adams' chapter explores some points of commonality and divergence between Swinburne's substance dualism and the hylomorphism of medievals such as Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham. Adams suggests that Swinburne and the medievals agree upon the functional dependence of the mind upon the body, but whereas Swinburne holds that the essence of a human person is an immaterial soul substance whilst the extended physical substance (the body) is nonessential, the medievals held a quite different picture on which the soul is something like the organizing principle of the body. Adams closes with a fascinating reflection on whether the problem of evil is exacerbated by dualism of the sort Swinburne favours, given its inability to explain why God would place human souls in physical bodies with all the attendant pain and anguish that comes with an embodied life. She suggests that her preferred medieval hylomorphism offers a satisfying explanation: namely, being embodied is essential to humans.

Overall, this collection makes an excellent companion to the work of Swinburne. The level of prior familiarity with technical vocabulary varies somewhat, but most of the essays would be suitable for use in both graduate and undergraduate level teaching.