Reason and Nature: Essays in the Theory of Rationality

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Bermudez, J.L. and Millar, Alan (eds.), Reason and Nature: Essays in the Theory of Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2002, 286pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199256837.

Reviewed by Todd Stewart , Illinois State University


Reason and Nature is a collection of essays, either recently published elsewhere or brand new, concerning both epistemic and practical rationality. The essays span the fields of epistemology, meta-ethics, evolutionary psychology, and cognitive science. One of the stated goals of the volume is to bring together a variety of perspectives and approaches to rationality. In keeping with this goal, the volume is loosely organized into two sections. The papers appearing in the first group focus on more purely philosophical approaches to rationality and in particular the status of norms of rationality and the shape these norms take. In contrast, the articles in the second group tend to take an evolutionary psychological or cognitive scientific perspective on the question of what place rationality has in psychological and causal explanations. This division is a bit misleading insofar as some papers in the second group, e.g., Levi’s, concern far more than whether or not rationality is a useful explanatory concept, but it does help to provide some limited structure. Another general theme, although one taken up only sporadically by the entries in the collection, is whether rationality can be naturalized. A little fewer than half of the papers are critical evaluations of other papers in the volume, and so there is often a proposal-then-response feel to the volume. This is not unwelcome, though, since the essays are uniformly quite interesting. Since the papers as a whole do not share any single theme, in this review I will briefly outline most of the papers and provide some critical remarks.

The first substantive entries are an exchange between Paul Boghossian (“How are Objective Epistemic Reasons Possible”) and Crispin Wright (“On Basic Logical Knowledge”) about the treat of epistemic relativism and the justification of objective norms of epistemic rationality. Boghossian argues that there is a real problem about the justification of objective, universally binding norms of rationality. The justification of a norm, thinks Boghossian, comes about through the justification of a belief that the norm is objective. The problem is to explain how such a belief could be justified, and justified in a way that means the agent is epistemically responsible when employing the rule. Appeals to pure intuition are unhelpful and mysterious and so do not make clear how a belief in the objectivity of a norm is justified. There is as of yet no good account of why such beliefs might be default-reasonable, and attempts at an inferential justification of the belief inevitably become rule-circular (e.g., need to rely on the rule in question in order to justify the belief about the goodness of the rule), at least when fundamental logical rules like modus ponens are concerned (20-28). Since none of these options seem particularly appealing, epistemic relativism or noncognitivism (non-factualism) are serious possibilities (28-34).

Boghossian attempts to defend the objectivity of norms of logic by arguing that some inferential dispositions constitute and fix the meanings of key logical terms (e.g., the conditional) and that an agent is not irresponsible to have and act upon such dispositions prior to and independent of an explicit justification of the belief that the rules are objective. Some rule-circular arguments, thinks Boghossian, can produce justified beliefs in their conclusions, but only when the inference involved is a meaning-constituting inference (35-40). Wright attacks the connection between meaning-constitution and responsibility, pointing out that just because an inferential disposition is part of the meaning of a concept, it does not follow that an agent is responsible in inferring in this way (62). Most obviously, the agent may fail to appreciate the meaning-constituting nature of the inference. Wright thus opens up the possibility that perhaps some sort of simple externalism about the justification of fundamental rules of inference which eschews the notion of responsibility in favor of warrant, perhaps through pure intuition, is a possibility that should be taken seriously after all.

Both papers are quite good but I think they could benefit by placing some of the issues into a wider epistemological context. In particular, there is a growing literature on epistemic circularity, and rule-circularity of the form discussed is arguably simply another form of epistemic circularity.1 Other instances of epistemic circularity include arguments for the reliability of sense perception that are inductive inferences from premises that have their origin in perception and inductive arguments for the reliability of induction. As with rules of deductive reasoning, it is not obvious how to make room for, e.g., responsible sensory belief. Pure intuitions about the reliability of sense perception seem more hopeless than in the logical case; it is not entirely clear why sensory beliefs would be default-reasonable; and an epistemically circular argument for the reliability of sense perception seems unconvincing. This begins to suggest that we should find some other response to epistemic circularity generally, perhaps either by allowing that some epistemically circular arguments do result in justified beliefs (but not simply in the meaning-constituting case as Boghossian would have it) or that no justification is required.2 Viewed in this light, the putative problem for norms of reason is not all that peculiar and looks to be an instance of a more general epistemic problem. If this is correct, it seems that what we require is a general solution to the problem, not one that exploits idiosyncratic features of logic (e.g., that some inferential dispositions are meaning constituting).

John Broome argues in “Practical Reasoning” that there is an important difference between reasons and normative requirements. If a person intends to do something, then this imposes a rational requirement to take necessary or the best means to fulfill that intention (92-7). But, if, e.g., the intention itself is unreasonable, then one can be normatively required to do something without its being that case that one has a reason to do it. Broome thinks that both practical and epistemic normative requirements are fixed by the contents of the propositions involved and in this sense have the same logic (89). Instrumental rationality is thus a matter of meeting rational requirements which may or may not translate into reasons. Alan Millar’s “Reasons for Action and Instrumental Rationality” explores similar themes.

In “The Rational Analysis of Human Cognition,” Nick Chater and Mike Oaksford explore the relationship between formal principles of reasoning and the sort of rationality that human beings exhibit most of the time (135-47). They propose a method of rational analysis that attempts to explain why human beings are so successful in their everyday lives (147-53). Their idea is that the fact that human beings are rational in their everyday lives is best explained by the fact that human beings act in accord with the outputs of formal principles even if they do not reason according to these principles. Many actions seem rational and well suited to the environment because people employ fast, frugal, and reliable mechanisms of decision making and planning that often accord with the outputs of formal principles. Formal principles are supposed to explain the everyday rationality of human beings. The authors apply rational analysis to argue that human performance on the Wason selection task is actually rational and plausible when we understand the task in terms of inductive inferences and real world pressures for information gain (153-60).

E.J. Lowe’s “The Rational and the Real” offers criticisms of Chater and Oaksford, arguing that they run together two distinct notions when performing rational analysis, namely rationalization and causal explanation. The fact that in everyday life we often act in ways that might be rationalized by appeal to formal principles does not causally explain why those actions take place or why a cognitive/behavioral system came to be a certain way (180). This criticism is fairly convincing against the view as presented by Chater and Oaksford. Lowe is careful not to overstate his argument, and in the end rests with the assertion that there are all sorts of plausible explanations of the existence of various modules in terms of adaptiveness that make no mention of optimality or formal principles.

Chater and Oaksford might try to shift to explaining not just the fact that people exhibit a good deal of everyday rationality but the fact that people are quite often successful in achieving their goals. One possible explanation of this is that evolutionary pressures for adaptation tend to produce fast and frugal modules that usually produce results that can be justified/rationalized by formal principles. The existence of these modules might be causally explained if we make the assumption that formal rationality has a connection to some sorts of success in the world. It could then be argued that evolution favored these modules because they are successful, but they are successful because they mimic the operation of more reliable but less computationally tractable formal principles. Lowe’s final point will still be in effect; this would be one of several available explanations of the existence and performance of certain modules, but it seems that this explanation could sometimes be the best one. It does make sense that sometimes evolution produces or favors an adaptation because that thing is closer to optimal (here, an output of a computationally unlimited reasoner employing the correct formal rules) than other competing adaptations if we assume that an optimal decision is one most likely to lead to success.

David Over argues against the view that human rationality consists entirely of domain-specific modules (the massive modularity hypothesis) in his “The Rationality of Evolutionary Psychology.” First, such modules need to be integrated together somehow to allow for complex planning, and the relation between modules and final decisions is difficult to understand if the massive modularity hypothesis is true (201). Second, it is at least plausible that some sort of sorting needs to be done before a module is engaged; a cognitive/behavioral system needs to determine, for example, which domain-specific module to activate, and this smacks of some sort of centralized processing of some sort. Domain-general reasoning also plays the vital role of filling in gaps between domain-specific modules and allows for flexible responses to unusual occurrences in the environment. He explores and rejects some putative empirical data for the massive modularity hypothesis, e.g., people perform differently on problems that are thought to share the same logical structure (192-201).

Isaac Levi’s ambitious “Commitment and Change in View” attempts to make room for epistemic responsibility while arguing that rationality has no place in causal explanations. Levi sharply distinguishes rational commitment and the implementation of changes in commitment. He thinks that while we can directly control rational commitment, our behaviors lag behind because it is sometimes difficult to implement these changes in our actions (211; 224). Rational commitment, then, is not the same thing as a belief, functionally construed. A commitment to a rational requirement is putatively part of the shared background of all inquirers, and includes things like logical closure and coherence among commitments. One unsatisfying part of Levi’s account is that he fails to make clear why we do have control over rational commitment; the most he offers is the claim that if an agent thinks in terms of normative commitments, then this implies the agent has control (222). However, just because rational commitment is not a causal notion, this does not entail that we can control our rational commitments, and an agent’s viewing himself as capable of normative commitments does not rule out an error-theory. As for the role of rationality in explanation, Levi thinks that human beings are so far from meeting the ideals of rational commitment that explanations in terms of rational commitment cannot serve as a good way of explaining human behavior. To the extent that rationality is involved in explanations, Levi argues it is a place-holder for a better naturalistic explanation, much like dormative virtues (216-223).

Allan Gibbard proposes an interesting quasi-naturalistic view of rationality in his “Normative Explainings: Invoking Rationality to Explain Happenings.” The idea is that while all properties are naturalistic, including those that instantiate rationality, it does not follow that the concept of rationality is naturalistic (264; 272). According to Gibbard, rationality is not a causal/explanatory concept, although it is realized by purely natural properties. Rather, judgments of rationality are essentially about how one ought to reason in specific conditions. To call someone irrational is to assert that you do not think that they should reason in the way which they in fact reasoned (if I were in their position, let me not reason that way) (270). This might explain something causal, for example, why a person tends to fail to achieve her goals, but it contains an essential normative component which is not causal. Disagreements about rationality between conceptually competent persons are supposed to persist even given agreement about the natural facts, and this Gibbard takes to support the view that reason is not entirely a descriptive naturalistic concept (276-9). Instead, rationality is a concept that has its place in making plans about the future and in coordinating social planning (274). Gibbard concludes that rationality is a non-natural concept the application of which supervenes on purely naturalistic properties (for a given individual), but a concept which should be banished from science (279). Explanations of a person’s failure, for example, are better couched in terms of the naturalistic properties which the non-natural concept of rationality picks out.

In need of some clarification is what, exactly, it takes for a concept to count as non-natural, and what this is meant to show about the concept. Supposing Gibbard is correct that explanations in terms of rationality are not purely causal, it is not immediately obvious why this shows that the concept of rationality is itself non-natural. If all non-natural means in this context is that a concept is not purely descriptive of the natural world (perhaps because its content is not simply the naturalistic property which it represents), then Gibbard’s conclusion would follow. Why, though, is a concept non-natural just because it fails to be descriptive? As Gibbard makes clear with his own proposals, concepts can have roles other than mere description. The mere fact that a concept has a primary role other than causal explanation does not seem to show that it is non-natural in any more robust sense than that it, trivially, is not simply purely descriptive of natural properties. What is needed is an argument for the view, then, that we should understand naturalistic concepts as being causal/explanatory or purely descriptive. Still, Gibbard’s paper advances an interesting alternative understanding of the relationship of rationality and nature.

Reason and Nature is a very nice collection of papers which succeeds in bringing together a variety of perspectives about reasoning. All of them are well written and worth study, and Bermúdez and Millar select very appropriate papers. Because the entries cover a host of different topics, not all of the papers are likely to be of interest to a single reader. Still, it is a volume well worth reading by those interested in philosophical or cognitive scientific approaches to reasoning.


1. See, e.g., William Alston, (1986) “Epistemic Circularity,” reprinted in Epistemic Justification (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989) and Markus Lammenranta, (1996) “Reliabilism and Circularity,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, LVI, for some treatments of epistemic circularity.

2. For an interesting alternative, see John Pollock and Joseph Cruz, Contemporary Theories of Knowledge, 2nd ed. (Boulder, CO: Rowman & Littlefield, 1999). They argue that many sensory beliefs are default-reasonable because part of the meaning-constituting conceptual norms of physical-object concepts permit the formation of perceptual beliefs when in certain sensory states. Notice that this would be, in a sense, to diminish the distinctiveness of the problem Boghossian constructs for logical norms and to extend his proposed solution to perception as well.