Reason and Persuasion: Three Dialogues by Plato: Euthyphro, Meno, Republic Book I

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John Holbo, Reason and Persuasion: Three Dialogues by Plato: Euthyphro, Meno, Republic Book I, Prentice-Hall, 2009, 389pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9789810682767.

Reviewed by Paul Carelli, University of North Florida







There is no dearth of textbooks offering an introduction to Plato’s thought, but Holbo’s stands apart in the scope of its introductory material and its user-friendly style. The book is divided into two parts. The first part, taking up a full quarter of the volume, introduces Socrates, Plato and the whole issue of how to read a Socratic dialogue. The second part is comprised of the three dialogues — Euthyphro, Meno and Republic I — each with its own forty or so page commentary. Thus more than half of the book is aimed at making the dialogues accessible to students who are without any prior experience reading Plato in particular or philosophy in general. The colloquial yet accurate translation by Belle Waring serves to reduce the distance between the student and the world of the dialogues still further and the illustrations found throughout punctuate the text with what Holbo calls bullet points without words. One concern I had reading the text with a mind to possibly adopting it for a course is that the introductory material is almost too thorough. The commentaries for the individual dialogues come before the dialogues themselves and so are presented more as introductions to be read before the dialogues rather than commentaries to be read along with them. It benefits students, I believe, to wrestle a bit with Plato on their own before turning to secondary material for aid and explication, and having these commentaries close at hand and presented prior to the dialogues themselves may prove too much of a temptation for bewildered students even if the dialogues are assigned first. If, however, the book is used not for a course in ancient philosophy but a more general interdisciplinary course, like the one for which the book was originally developed, this material may be more an asset than a detriment.

The general introduction tackles the problem of Socrates’ role in Plato’s dialogues. Is Plato a Russian doll hiding within him an authentic Socratic core or is the character of Socrates just a mask for Plato to wear while he presents he own ideas? The question whether Socrates is a historical representation, a mouthpiece or a little of both is left unresolved and the standard view of the division of the dialogues into early, middle and late is presented but not pushed. There are generous excerpts from the Apology, and Socrates’ denial of wisdom, relationship to the Sophists and depiction in the Clouds are all explored. In sum, Socrates is a puzzle, using his elenchus for the negative result of showing ignorance in others while at the same time undertaking the positive task of searching for definitions that will do his interlocutors some good to know, all the while espousing his own ignorance in such matters. Such paradoxes are characteristic of the puppet show that Plato presents, but it all serves to place the burden of figuring out what the answer is squarely on the reader; the dialogues are not meant to be accepted as authorities but surpassed. In his middle period Plato does seem to offer his own answer, and a thorough explication of both the Myth of the Cave and the Divided Line show that answer to be a belief in intangible and unchanging Forms. Even if we choose not to follow Plato and his sometimes mystical notion of the Forms, however, we can still gain a great deal of insight by considering the reasons behind his answers. There is a parallel between the situation in which the cave dwellers find themselves and the social-political climate of Athens in Plato’s time. There is a parallel for us as well, as long as we give more credence to those who peddle mere persuasion, like Dale Carnegie (author of How to Win Friends and Influence People and here cast as a modern day sophist), than to those who seek the truth through reasoning. Regardless of how we judge Plato’s metaphysics and epistemology, we can still find worth in his project as a corrective to the notion that leading the good life is a matter of just acquiring good people skills. Plato’s intention in writing his dialogues may have been to soften his readers up for his particular school of thought, but in reading these dialogues we may soften ourselves up to philosophy in general.

The Euthyphro is sometimes a difficult first dialogue for students not only because they are not used to the Socratic elenchus but also because they are blind to how audacious it was to the ancient Greeks for a son to bring a charge of murder against his father. Why would Socrates object to bringing a murderer to justice and why would he try to help his friend by asking him to define piety? There is a parallel between this dialogue and a teaching of Confucius concerning a son’s actions in response to his father stealing a sheep. In both cases there is a clear tension between a strict adherence to the law and the demands of filial piety. But Euthyphro, whose name means ‘straight thinker’ or ‘right minded’, boldly claims to know what piety is, and if he is prepared to take his father to court on a technicality he should be willing to have a technical discussion about the definition of piety. The Socratic assumption that knowing what piety means is important for acting piously could not be lost on Euthyphro since he himself claims to be bringing his father to court precisely because he knows that to do so is pious. In some sense, then, Socrates is arguing with Euthyphro on his own terms. Holbo fills in more background to the dialogue by discussing Aristophanes’ Birds and Aeschylus’ Orestia, and gives a thorough analysis of Euthyphro’s failed definitions of piety.

The Meno presents its own difficulties for new students. In particular, the exercise in geometry in the middle of the dialogue is rarely given much credence by first time readers — Socrates seems to be asking the slave boy leading questions and it is not immediately obvious what the connection could be between geometry and virtue. The dialogue, however, is not really about virtue but about knowledge and justification. Meno is after the power that Gorgias and other sophists offer him and it is this power that he identifies with virtue. This power, of course, is the power of speaking persuasively. Dale Carnegie is again invoked, this time echoing Meno’s paradox that learning is impossible while at the same time offering no end of advice on how to answer any question one might ask. Meno is in the same contradictory position as this latter day Gorgias, simultaneously claiming that he has knowledge and can expound on the nature of virtue before a multitude, while taking refuge in the impossibility of inquiry whenever a seasoned questioner like Socrates gives him a little difficulty. It may seem to the unseasoned reader that the difficulties Meno is put through are merely Socratic tricks and word games. After all, what exactly is wrong with giving a list of good examples when trying to define what something is? This certainly does seem to work in some cases. But the geometry lesson puts the onus of proof back onto Meno. If true inquiry is impossible there is at least something very much like it, recollection, and this is enough to show that mere persuasion without knowledge is not power.

The commentary for Republic Book I is taken up by a description of the city that Socrates constructs later in the dialogue, an extensive discussion of how justice can be viewed as a craft, and an analysis of the three interlocutors. The three represent the three parts of the soul: Cephalus is reason, Polemachus the spirit and Thrasymacus the appetites. The last is the hardest to pin down, but as the representation of the hydra-headed part of the soul this is not surprising. He may seem, at different times, like a relativist, a realist, a naturalist or a conventionalist. In fact he is an egoist who trades off an equivocation on the word justice, using it at one time descriptively and at another time prescriptively. He is the embodiment of everything that Plato is against in these three dialogues and, in a sense, is what Meno and Polemarchus are aiming at, even if they themselves do not realize it. By continually tripping him up Socrates shows that persuasion is powerless in the presence of reason.

Holbo’s commentaries on these three dialogues serve to situate them both as individual works and also as parts of Plato’s overall project of showing the problems of persuasion divorced from reason. Rather than taking a strictly scholarly approach the author has made clear the relevance of these texts for questions even non-philosophers should find worth asking. For instructors seeking an introductory text for first time readers of Plato, Holbo’s book is worthy of consideration.