Reason and Rationality

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Maria Cristina Amoretti and Nicla Vassallo (eds.), Reason and Rationality, Ontos, 2012, 247pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381634.

Reviewed by Amber L. Griffioen, Universität Konstanz


I was pleased to see Amoretti and Vassallo preface the introduction to their anthology on reason and rationality by quoting the last stanza of one of my favorite poems by Emily Dickinson: "And then a Plank in Reason, broke, / And I dropped down, and down -- / And hit a World, at every plunge, / And Finished knowing -- then -- ".[1] Although the essays are not concerned as much as I would like with what happens when "planks" in reason "break" (i.e., with issues of irrationality), the open-endedness of Dickinson's last stanza can be reappropriated to show the countless levels and assorted applications of the terms 'reason' and 'rationality', which is the theme to which the book is dedicated.

Indeed, the editors take great pains in their introduction, "The Life According to Reason is Best and Pleasantest", to demonstrate just how varied the understandings and functions of these terms are in the philosophical literature.[2]  Much of their discussion is about various philosophical distinctions haivng to do with reason and rationality -- theoretical vs. practical reason; justificatory/normative vs. explanatory/motivating reasons;[3] coherence vs. process rationality; normative vs. deontological vs. consequentialist rationality; perfect vs. bounded rationality; and so on. They ultimately conclude that it is important to examine the "concrete instantiations" of 'reason[s]', 'rationality', and related terms from within various fields of inquiry, and it is to this goal that the book ambitiously commits itself.

Each of the ten chapters discusses the relation of reason to one area of inquiry, including: science, knowledge, woman, politics, ethics, religion, aesthetics, language, logic, and metaphysics. They guide the reader through some of the more relevant positions and recent literature on the topic in question, ultimately arguing for some particular understanding of reason and rationality (or a related concept). All in all, I think this book is a stimulating and comprehensive introduction to questions of reason and rationality from within particular philosophical subfields. Most of the essays could provide advanced undergraduate or graduate students instructive introductions to the most prominent and current ideas on these issues. Lacking the space here to extensively discuss each chapter, I will briefly summarize them and comment in a little more detail on a few arguments I found interesting and/or problematic.

Stathis Psillos ("Reason and Science") explores the problem of induction. Distinguishing between what he calls premise-circularity ("an argument such that its conclusion is among its premises" (42)) and rule-circularity ("[in which] the argument itself is an instance, or involves essentially an application, of the rule of inference whose reliability is asserted in the conclusion" (43)), Psillos argues that only premise-circularity and not rule-circularity is viciously circular and that an inferential justification of induction is an instance of the latter. Further, he claims we have reason to rely on induction and other basic inferential rules we accept because we value them -- and "we value them because they are . . . rules we employ and reply [sic] upon to form beliefs . . . [which] have tended to generate true beliefs" (44). Psillos expands on the importance of shared values by claiming that we need to appeal to values and virtues that scientists share and want their theories to have, in order to offer a rational critique of method and theory-change in science (cf. 48-9).

In "Reason and Knowledge"[4], Pascal Engel does a fine job of laying out the conceptual territory of contemporary epistemology. He introduces us to internalist and externalist conceptions of knowledge and reasons for belief, moving on to "no-reason" views that "try to dispense with any independent account of justification and of reasons" altogether,[5] through accounts that appeal to safety, landing ultimately at basing relations. Engel then submits that "the internalist requirements on reasons are well motivated, and that an externalist theory of knowledge has to take them into account anyway" (60). After a helpful discussion of internal reasons and entitlement (60-64), he proposes a version of epistemic compatibilism, which "combines externalist elements -- since it allows a definition of knowledge as ungettierised safe belief, and does not require access -- with internalist elements -- since beliefs have to be sensitive to reasons and to epistemic norms" (65). I found this chapter both highly engaging and easy to wade through and would recommend it for use in introductory epistemology courses.

Lorraine Code ("Reason and Woman") presents an important and less widely-discussed approach to the subject,in which she critiques Enlightenment approaches to reason and rationality and their emphasis on features like detachment, autonomy, universality, and purity. Code give us an overview of her work and that of a few related feminist and post-colonial philosophers. They argue that the "ideals of reason that underwrite conceptions of knowledge, objectivity, formal validity, and moral authority have been modeled on and generate models for white male achievement in the propertied, professional classes of western/northern affluent societies" and that there are real "exclusionary consequences that derive, ironically, from reason's claims to formal purity and universality" (74). Code claims that, from the Enlightenment concept of reason down to its contemporary Anglo-American heirs, "questions about who the knowing subject is or was are traditionally absent and deemed inconsequential" (78). Thus, as I understand her, we need to look to the particularity of epistemic agents and their relations to others and the world around them, in order to guard against (or at least make ourselves aware of) the potentially hypocritical ways in which agents have been excluded by the very notions of reason operating in the "mainstream".

Code goes on to endorse what she calls ecological thinking, which

offers a frame for reconfiguring knowledge, rationality, sociality, and subjectivity, and reexamining the potential of epistemic and ethico-political practices to produce habitats where people can live well together, and respectfully with and within the physical/natural world. (84)

It is not entirely clear to me what this "radically innovative conceptual apparatus" which should "infiltrate the social order where it can expand to undermine the intransigent hierarchical arrangements that hold it in place" (85) is supposed to look like. My understanding, however, is that it involves a suspicion regarding overgeneralizations and potentially exclusive terms and policies, adopts an interdisciplinary approach, and places an emphasis on epistemic diversity, ideally replacing (or at least supplementing) the "epistemological monoculture" of Western Anglo-American philosophy (cf. 85-87).

That said, Code is not always exactly clear about which problems she is addressing: a) the fact that Enlightenment models are internally inconsistent; and/or b) that their proponents are hypocritical; c) the fact that Enlightenment models of rationality exclude features like emotionality and intersubjectivity, which have traditionally been identified with femininity, and thereby exclude women; or d) the fact that these features have been identified with femininity in the first place. Further, it is not clear what the solution is supposed to be. To reject Enlightenment models of reason altogether? To show that women, too, meet Enlightenment criteria? Or to develop a new model of rationality that incorporates traditionally "feminine" features, thereby continuing to identify with categories that are themselves the result of discrimination and exclusion? None of these options really seems viable. Code seems to be aware of this problem (cf. 80: "the dilemmas those of us working within and against this legacy must face"), and perhaps it is enough to simply make us aware of the socio-ethico-politico-historical problems we face when trying to clarify and/or revise our concepts.

In "Reason and Politics", Liz Sperling argues that the Rawlsian notion of public reason may serve to break down structures that have typically excluded certain parties from political participation. She claims that the 20th century presented social contract theory with new challenges, offering up a choice between a kind of self-reliant egoism and "reasonable individuals placing their interests in a context of co-operation" (94). She sets up Nozickian individualism as a contrast to the Rawlsian picture, showing how individualistic and fear-driven market-led consumerism may undermine political reason, and argues that a return to reason will involve the re-cultivation of trust between citizen and citizen and between citizens and politicians. Public reason, she argues, should not be so disinterested as to exclude private considerations like moral values, as "it is these that grace public debate with necessary diversity to reach inclusive decisions" (103). Rather, individuals should be encouraged to participate in the public dialogue with "respect and reciprocity" (102), which is only possibly if the relevant trust relationships have been established.

As Engel did with epistemology, Carla Bagnoli ("Reason and Ethics") takes us through the conceptual territory of the reasons-debate in normative and meta-ethics. In this chapter, Bagnoli is primarily concerned with the possibility of practical reason. She begins by claiming that "several ethical theories lead to skeptical conclusions about practical reason", citing as examples sentimentalism and dogmatic rationalism (111).[6] Bagnoli reviews the debates regarding explanatory, normative, and operative reasons (112-113); objective and subjective reasons (113-114); motivating and justificatory reasons (114-115); and theories of normative reasons (115-116). She then defends a "Kantian constructivist conception of the role [practical reason] plays in ethics" (117) that rests on autonomy, in contrast to views that only make room for practical reason as something "ancillary to the passions" or which "plays at most an instrumental role in planning actions" (118). She also distinguishes constructivism from moral realism, labeling her view "a form of irrealist cognitivism" (124).[7]

In "Reason and Religion", Lynne Rudder Baker considers what she calls the "Evidentialist Master Argument" (EMA):

P1. If anyone is entitled to believe that God exists, then there is sufficient evidence for God's existence.

P2. There is not sufficient evidence for God's existence.

Therefore, C. No one is entitled to believe that God exists (131).

In presenting the most prevalent arguments for and against the EMA, she cites Clifford's evidentialism in favor of P1 and the problem of evil in support of P2, Plantinga's notion of warrant in opposition to P1 and Alston's view of religious experience in opposition to P2. She next discusses two more sophisticated versions of the EMA, the No-Rational-Disagreement Argument (NRD) and the Argument from Science (AS). NRD maintains that "if epistemic peers who fully discuss all their evidence cannot come to agreement on a proposition p, then neither is epistemically justified in believing that p" (137). Baker gives several persuasive arguments against NRD (though one might doubt that theists and atheists can ever really count as epistemic peers who share all their evidence -- at least if something like religious experience is in play as evidence). Baker goes on to criticize AS, claiming that its first premise ("If there is sufficient evidence for belief that God exists, then science provides it", 142) is ruled out by the very methodological naturalism that science presupposes. This has the result that EMA appears to be unsound in its various forms, though as Baker notes, this does not show that belief in God is rational. This is a very good article with several very clear examples.

Susan L. Feagin, in "Reason and Aesthetics", discusses the debate in aesthetics over whether "there is a logical role for reasons in arguments in support of a judgment . . . of artistic and of aesthetic value" (150). She takes us through various positions on critical argument, before moving to the question of whether an aesthetic quality can have a kind of "inherent polarity" -- i.e., "value or disvalue in itself, independently of its relationship to the rest of the work" (160). Feagin argues that the perception of a feature of a work as having some good-making property may prima facie justify beliefs or judgments regarding the work, but that this justification may be overridden or undermined by the feature's interaction with other features or its contribution to the work's overall function (161). Finally, she considers whether a particular perception of a feature as good- or bad-making can be warranted "when it is not based on an inference from an articulated reason that serves as a premise in an argument" (163). Feagin concludes that the way relevant concepts and background experiences inform the experiences may determine whether or not such a perception is warranted.

In "Reason and Language" Manuel García-Carpintero looks at four views that relate language and reasons. He claims that the first two -- Platonist and Chomskyan-type views -- both maintain that there is no significant relation between reasons and language, though it is not entirely clear why.[8] He goes on to discuss Davidsonian and Gricean views that contend "that linguistic features can only be clarified by relating them to motivating reasons" (173) and finally examines views that see language as constituting "speech-act potentials", relating language to normative reasons. Unfortunately, he is not entirely clear about what is under investigation: whether we can provide (explanatory or justificatory) reasons for certain intuitive judgments we make about language (linguistic knowledge), or for language itself. In some places, he seems to be interested in the etiology and justification of linguistic knowledge, in others, whether language itself is based on reasons that explain or justify it being as it is. Some further clarification on this point would be helpful.

Carlo Cellucci ("Reason and Logic") explores the views of Frege, Nagel, Hanna, and Cooper  on the relationship between logic and rationality. All four appear to claim that reason depends on logic. On Cellucci's reading, Frege, Nagel, and Hanna all seem to keep logic independent of naturalistic and evolutionary causes, so that logic is universal, mind-independent, objective, and reliable (even if our minds had to evolve the capacity to grasp such causes). Cooper, on the other hand, claims that the laws of logic are not independent of natural processes and that "logic is reducible to evolutionary theory" (Cooper, quoted on 202). Cellucci, too, wants to ground logic in evolution, but wants to claim that it is a product of both biological and cultural evolution. His discussion of the relation between reason, rationality, and logic is somewhat muddled, however, and a bit more clarity would have been nice.[9] Further, there are several places in which reference is made to empirical studies that are not cited anywhere in the article. Nevertheless, this is an interesting proposal for future research.

Finally, in "Reason and Metaphysics", Andrea Bottani explores the transition of metaphysics from representing a kind of Aristotelian First Philosophy to a Kantian rational inquiry into the nature of Reason itself. That is, metaphysics becomes "not only a discourse of reason but also . . . a discourse about reason" (221). Bottani ultimately concludes that "metaphysics is more a theory of the way reality could or could not have been than a theory of the way it actually is" -- and that metaphysics is more about systematization in a coherentist sense than about ontological identification in a foundationalist sense. Thus, the rational adjudication between metaphysical theories has more to do with "considerations of ontological economy, versions of Ockham's razor, cognitive simplicity and elegance, capacity to preserve current intuitions, coherence with science or common sense, and so on" (234). The essay provides a good overview of various movements in metaphysics throughout the history of philosophy, and an approach to metaphysics that might help students struggling with the difficulty of never arriving at settled answers.

All in all, Reason and Rationality provides a comprehensive overview of philosophical issues relating to these difficult concepts. I should note here that there are several typological, grammatical, and stylistic errors in the text that sometimes threaten readability, but this alone should not dissuade potential readers from consulting this volume for its valuable philosophical material.

[1] E. Dickinson (1862), "I Felt a Funeral in My Brain". The authors do not give the full citation, but the poem can be found in: The Manuscript Books of Emily Dickinson, Volume I, R.W. Franklin (Ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981, no. 280.

[2] Nevertheless, they write:

Broadly speaking, reason may be considered the ensemble of our intellectual abilities: our general capacities for forming beliefs, comprehending, inferring, making judgments, thinking and choosing actions on principles and norms. In this sense, failing to employ reason implies exercising non-rational processes, including blind faith, wishful thinking, guessing, or careless obedience to some kind of authority. Rationality . . . may thus be simply considered the everyday exercise of reason in exploring, investigating, understanding, controlling, and manipulating both the natural and social worlds (10).

The editors claim that these "general characterizations . . . are not exceptionally controversial and may be widely accepted" (10). Yet some philosophers might balk at these "general characterizations". First, it makes the notion of reason appear heavily cognitive. Second, their characterizations of what they call 'non-rational processes' are, given their own general characterization of reason, far from non-rational -- though they may be ir-rational. The agents in question are still in the business of believing (even if wishfully or blindly), of giving and responding to reasons (even if guessing), and/or of understanding and acting on certain concepts (e.g., what an "authority" is and what it is to be "obedient"). The opposite of rationality is not irrationality but a-rationality, yet these are far from examples of the latter. However, this merely points to the difficulties we encounter as soon as we try to nail down just what we understand by 'reason' and 'rationality' and the various problems that arise when we try to give a general definition.

[3] A mistake on p.12 conflates the clarifications of justificatory/normative reasons and explanatory/motivating reasons. This could lead to gross misunderstandings for beginning readers.

[4] Strangely, titled the other way around (i.e., "Knowledge and Reason") on p.53.

[5] Engel cites, among others, Nozick, Goldman, Armstrong, Williamson, Sutton, and Sosa as proponents of various types of these "radical" epistemologies (cf. 58).

[6] It is not clear that either of these theories need deny that practical reason is possible. In the case of sentimentalism, reason can be employed both to debate non-moral matters that causally affect our moral sentiments and (presumably) in instrumental considerations, which although not necessarily moral, may still be practical. In the case of dogmatic rationalism, one can still say that reason is practical insofar as the truths it tracks down are those that (supposedly) guide action, as opposed to merely entering into the content of beliefs.

[7] Whether Bagnoli's account can provide us with reason to criticize agents who don't care about morality or about being autonomous, self-legislating individuals is questionable, as is the problem of what exactly constitutes wrongdoing on this account. But this is a problem for constructivism in general and not just for Bagnoli.

[8] García-Carpintero claims that reasons are normally assumed to be "under the control of a conscious system of decision and deliberation" (179), but it is not entirely clear why this must be, especially in the case of motivating or explanatory reasons.

[9] First, he claims that reason "is the capability of choosing appropriate means for some given ends", whereas rationality is the "exercise of [this capacity of] reason" (203). This, of course, makes reason appear purely instrumental. Whether there is a role for theoretical reason is not clear. Logic, however, is "that reasoning faculty which permits to choose [sic] appropriate means for some given ends" (207), making it simply appear co-extensive with reason. Later, however, he maintains that logic is only a part of reason, since emotions, feelings, and other biologically determined phenomena should also be included in the sphere of rationality (212). Indeed, the role of logic is to "find hypotheses about the environment to the end of survival" (213).