Reason and Religion

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Nicholas Rescher, Reason and Religion, Ontos, 2013, 117pp., $83.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381870.

Reviewed by Evan Fales, The University of Iowa


This short book is the latest in an astonishingly prolific list of titles from the pen of Nicholas Rescher. The Preface announces that its purpose is to seek conciliation between science and religion. That agenda is fleshed out by way of arguments on behalf of two main theses: 1) a "division-of-labor" claim, to the effect that science and religion employ different methods and aim at different goals, and 2) an extended defense of theism against the problem of the existence of natural evil. En passant, we are offered various observations on the relationship between religion and morality.

The first order of business is to show (or at any rate to claim) that science and religion pursue different ends, rather in the spirit of Stephen Jay Gould's nonoverlapping magisteria:

Science and religion have different jobs to do: they are human enterprises whose aims and objectives differ. Science deals with the matter of how things happen in the world -- that is with issues regarding explanation, prediction, and control of the world's occurrences. Religion, by contrast, addresses normative issues and involves questions of meaning and value -- questions bound up with the master question of what we ought to do with our lives and how we ought to conduct them. . . . science takes a cognitive approach of asking about the world and its doings. Religion by contrast takes an appreciative approach of affinity, awe, and wonder. The concern of religion is not from [sic] the world as such but from [sic] our personal place within it in relation to what is important and meaningful to us. (p. 2)

That sounds rather like Gould. But Rescher appears to think religion also has a cognitive role to play after all. He says:

the proper role of faith is not to provide a rational explanation for what happens in the universe, but rather to underwrite the idea that such an explanation is always in principle available -- something which science cannot quite manage on its own. (p. 7)

Unfortunately, Rescher does not tell us what such "underwriting" consists in, nor what it means to say that an explanation is "always in principle available." A plausible surmise, perhaps, is that Rescher means to be implying a metaphysical thesis that God somehow guarantees or establishes a law-governed universe. However, that would surely suggest a role for religion that goes beyond -- even if it might be relevant to -- questions of "meaning."

Again, although a role of religion is to guide judgments of value, a cognitive dimension appears to be implied, so perhaps the distinction between (knowledge of) fact and value is not as clean as Rescher sometimes wants to suggest:

The present approach to theism views it as grounded in authentic knowledge but not knowledge of the observational sort . . . but rather knowledge of the inferential sort that is not [sic??] of the best-available explanatory systematization of our overall experience, with affective experience emphatically included above and beyond the observational. (p. 12)

However that may be, Rescher goes on to emphasize the pragmatic grounds for religious faith in helping us to become better persons. This, as he sees things, is not the (proper) domain of the sciences, but also does not conflict with that domain. Where there appear to be conflicts between scientific discoveries and religious doctrine, Rescher naturally invokes "separation of powers," yet suggests (p. 26) that we may choose between four recourses: (a) abandon the religious doctrine in deference to science, (b) defer judgment, (c) accept both, and the resulting "inconsistency" -- i.e., mystery, or (d) humility -- i.e., acknowledge human ignorance. It is unsettling, I should think, that none of these four options points to a way out of the conflicts that coheres with the nonoverlapping magisteria ideal.

Rescher goes on to tackle, quite briefly, a portfolio of (often science-based) objections to religious belief. As might be expected, for example, he is not impressed with scientific explanations of religious belief as a product of evolution or as powerful because it satisfies deep human needs. Given his pragmatism, the latter, for Rescher, is an argument in its favor. Another is that religion -- so Rescher argues -- helps us to become moral human beings: "Without religion, . . . it is somewhere between difficult and impossible to realize various salient positivities that are conducive, perhaps even to some extent indispensable, to human flourishing." (p. 39) (He may be right, though I know of little empirical evidence for that claim. This is not mere sniping on my part. Earlier (p. 33), Rescher has absolved religions of the harms wrought by individuals in their name; yet when it comes to judging a religion, he insists (p. 37) upon a "functionally oriented inquiry into the question of which religion it is which optimally accomplishes the aims and purposes for which religions are instituted")

In a very brief chapter on God's relation to morality, Rescher rejects Divine Command theories, on the familiar ground that they accept the voluntarist horn of the Euthyphro dilemma. Instead, Rescher adopts gratitude to God for His creation and providence as the source of a duty to honor God, from which the duty of obedience to the divine will follows. This is reminiscent of Robert Adams' view, though Adams accepts a divine-command theory of moral obligation. Rescher's treatment is much too brief to explore the ways in which a Divine Command theory might be integrated with the role he gives to gratitude. Indeed, the discussion leaves unexplored large issues in ethics -- e.g., whether the Platonic argument that one should pursue virtue because that is best for the soul might provide an alternative to the view that the existence of morality depends upon the existence of God.

More broadly, it seems to me that Rescher must confront the question of the relation between normative judgments and the factual judgments that are the purview of the sciences. For it is on the alleged distinction between these that his détente between religion and science depends. And there is, after all, an ancient tradition that holds that what is good and bad (for humans and other sentient creatures) depends upon our (their) natures -- and those natures are proper material for empirical investigation. Furthermore, it can be argued that what is right or wrong in the treatment of sentient creatures depends upon what is good and bad for them. These are difficult matters, but unless it can be shown that the normative is independent of the natural, Rescher's two magisteria threaten to collapse into one, and the tension between science and religion retains its force.

Chapter 5, the largest by far, is devoted to parrying the objection to theism from the existence of natural evil. Rescher has in mind a defense, not a theodicy. He tries to show that, for all the atheist knows, God has, in fact, created the best world possible (so far as the natural order is concerned). It's not that God has created a perfect world (here is invoked the Augustinian notion that created things are by nature finite and imperfect), but that (for all we know) He's created an optimal world. The argument turns on three claims: 1) the world is very, very complex; 2) all of the world's features are so intimately connected that any change has ramifications throughout the system; 3) the world is (in the technical sense) chaotic: a tiny change here can lead to (unpredictable) enormous changes far away in space and time.

When, then, the atheist suggests that God could have removed some particular evil or type of evil and so made a better world by, for example, changing the laws of nature or initial conditions a bit, Rescher's reply is that it's not enough for the atheist to suggest such possibilities. In order to make her case, the atheist must provide a blueprint for the allegedly better world, complete with a tracing-out of all the long-range consequences of any such proposed alteration in the natural order. And, because of the world's complexity, the atheist can't hope to satisfy that demand. Ergo -- for all anyone knows -- the world may indeed be optimal, the best that a perfect God could have created.

Now I believe a response on behalf of the atheist is not as tall an order as Rescher imagines. But before I come to that, I shall comment on a couple of the details of Rescher's argument. The most surprising argument in this chapter is one that is hard to make out, regarding the "logical interlinkage of facts." (pp. 57- 58) The idea seems to be that one can't -- logically can't -- construct a possible world like the actual one save only that some fact has been removed or replaced. It's logically impossible for change (in that sense) to be local. Now to be sure, it is (trivially) true that a change of some (contingent) true proposition p to a falsehood would also involve changing to falsehoods all the (infinitely many) true propositions that entail p. But if that is what Rescher is arguing -- and this is quite unclear -- then it's hard to see why the atheist should find it of any concern. If, on the other hand, Rescher means to be arguing for the claim that no fact is logically independent of any other, so that "any change anywhere has [as a matter of logical necessity] reverberations everywhere" (p. 58), then his conclusion is wildly implausible and I am unable to reconstruct his argument so that it entails this. The conclusion amounts to an anti-Humean position on steroids.

More plausible, surely, is the view that events in the universe are causally interconnected, in such a way that any change the atheist might demand of God would ramify throughout the world. Even that is false, of course, for ripple effects could only influence events in its future light cone. But set that aside. The core of Rescher's argument appeals to three features of the universe: the Butterfly Effect, the Package-Deal Predicament, and the Teeter-Totter Effect. The first involves the well-known idea that small changes can have major long-range consequences. The second is just the general point that the world is causally interconnected. And the third captures the notion that improving the world along one dimension may incur costs along another dimension, so that only optimal balance, not perfection on each dimension, is possible.

For a world more or less such as ours, these features seem often to obtain, and it may fairly be asked whether the atheist can really re-design the world in such a way as to produce a demonstrably better outcome than we actually find. Surely not. But shy of demonstration, there are the probabilities. Are we really in no position to estimate such probabilities? (Take non-human animal pain, for instance. It has its purposes, but those could be satisfied by re-engineering animals so that non-painful somatic sensors of bodily harm would induce the same harm-avoidance behaviors. What over-compensating ill would result?) One might here have recourse to skeptical theism. But that skepticism spills over into skepticism about consequentialist grounds for human action. It appears that Rescher's view here leaves him with just two options: 1) compatibilism respecting human free choices (and trust in divine providence), or 2) a radical skepticism (ironic for a pragmatist such as Rescher) concerning the possibility of well-informed rational action.

In any event, Rescher considers another tack that the atheist might try. Why confine oneself to tinkering with our world in search of improvements? Why not let imagination roam freely over much different possible worlds that God would have had better reason to create than this one? Alas for the atheist, Rescher thinks, this maneuver will offer no help -- for it won't do merely to partially imagine such a world. One needs to nail down and evaluate the goodness of all the details -- again an impossible task for creatures such as we. One might complain of God that He should have made us smarter, so that we could think such matters through and discover that our world is indeed the best. This complaint might seem ineffectual as an objection to Rescher; he will naturally point out that our intellectual limitations may well be part of what makes this world -- in ways obscure to us -- optimal.

But a somewhat more imaginative version of this objection will be much harder for Rescher to parry. For it seems to me that we can imagine the best possible world (and ours is emphatically not it). As far as I can see, there's nothing stopping God from creating a world comprised entirely of what I've elsewhere called Perfect-creatures. A Perfect-creature is a creature that is just like God -- save only that it lacks aseity. If, as I think, there could be such a world, then there could be none better.

In the book's penultimate chapter, Rescher speaks candidly about the problem of choosing a religion, and about the reasons for his own choice. He insists that ultimate responsibility for accepting the teaching authority of a given sect or denomination rests with the individual, but he allows -- following William James -- that such choices are culturally situated, in such a way that certain religious faiths will not be "living options." At the same time, he offers a criterion for rational choice: I must have good reason to believe that my church will "have at heart the best interests of people like me." (p. 94) Those interests include "achieving appropriate life-goals, realizing rational contentment (Aristotelian eudiamonia), getting guidance in shaping a life that one can look back upon with rational contentment." (p. 95) It is, by way of contrast, "not a matter of historically factual correctness so much as one of life-orienting efficacy." Some might, perhaps, balk at the minimizing of historical correctness.

The book might naturally have ended at this point. Rescher adds another short chapter, almost as an afterthought, concerning Aquinas' five ways. It is devoted to arguing that each of the five ways shows that God's existence provides an ultimate explanation for every fundamental aspect of the world, to wit: motion, change, necessity, value, and purpose.

As to matters of style, this new Rescher work is clearly and engagingly written, at a level comprehensible by the educated general reader. One wishes only that it had been carefully copyedited; it is woefully replete with typographical and other errors, a few of which quite effectively obscure meaning.