Reason and Value: Themes from the Moral Philosophy of Joseph Raz

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R. Jay Wallace, Samuel Scheffler, and Michael Smith, (eds.), Reason and Value: Themes from the Moral Philosophy of Joseph Raz, Oxford University Press, 2004, 448pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199261881.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


The essays in this collection are mostly on the nature and source of reasons, primarily practical reasons, and the relation of practical reasons to "oughts" and to morality. Drafts of many of the papers were presented at a conference in March, 2002 at Columbia University on Joseph Raz's philosophy.

I believe that all of the authors would accept T. M. Scanlon's definition of a reason as "a consideration that counts in favor of some attitude or action" ("Reasons: A Puzzling Duality?", p. 231). A theoretical reason, that is, a reason to believe will be a consideration that counts in favor of some belief. For instance, the fact that there are footprints in the sand is a consideration that counts in favor of the belief that someone recently walked there. A practical reason will be a consideration that counts in favor of a desire, intention, or action. For instance, the fact that taking an aspirin will cure my headache is a consideration that counts in favor of my desire and intention to go to the medicine cabinet and get an aspirin, and in favor of my action of going to the cabinet and getting one. Of course, as well as theoretical and practical reasons there can be reasons to wish for, hope for, or fear something, and to be angry, sad, happy, etc.

In "Reasons" John Broome says that a perfect reason is "an explanation of why you ought to Φ" (p. 35). He takes "the concept of ought and the concept of explain as primitives" (p. 32) and defines a perfect reason in terms of these concepts. For Broome, there are ought facts and reasons are facts that explain these ought facts (p. 32). For instance, it might be a fact that I ought to return some book I borrowed from you and the explanation might be the fact that I promised. Then the fact that I promised is the reason for me to return the book.

While Broome's view that requires a reason to be an explanation of an ought fact seems to apply to derivative oughts, it does not apply to fundamental ones. To use one of Broome's own examples (pp. 42-43), I ought not believe that it is Sunday and Wednesday. Why not? Because I ought not to believe both a proposition and a contrary proposition. By why ought I not believe such propositions? Perhaps because I ought to believe only true propositions, and a proposition and its contrary cannot both be true. But why ought I to believe only true propositions? At some point there will be no explanation of why I ought, or ought not, to believe certain sorts of propositions. Still, there will be reason to, or not to, believe those sorts of propositions.

Turning to practical oughts, suppose I ought to return your book because I promised. My promising explains why I ought and is a reason for me to return your book. But what about the fact that I ought to keep my promises? What explains that? Perhaps there is some rule-utilitarian or contractarian consideration that explains that. But then why ought I to do what such rules prescribe? At some point we will reach an end: I just ought to do X-type things. But being an X-type thing does not explain why I ought to do X-type things, and there will be no further explanation of why I ought to do X-type things when such oughts are non-derivative. It's just true that I ought to, and we can see that it is. Still, there is reason to do X-type things. But Broome must conclude there is not because there is no explanation of why we ought to do X-type things when those oughts are fundamental.

Suppose we just stick with the non-substantive account of reasons as considerations that count in favor of some attitude or action. Are reasons to do necessarily normative, that is, is it necessarily true that if there is a reason for you to do A, then pro tanto you ought to do A? Jonathan Dancy argues that not all reasons for action imply such oughts ("Enticing Reasons," pp. 91-118). That doing something would be fun, exciting, attractive, pleasant or nice are reasons to do that thing (pp. 99, 104, 118), and make it silly not to do it if there are no defeating reasons (pp. 99, 101, 103). But Dancy argues that they do not imply that a person ought to do that thing if there are no defeating reasons, nor that it would be irrational to fail to do it. On this view, it is not true that I ought to buy a convertible, nor that I am irrational if I do not, if convertibles are more fun, exciting, and attractive to me than non-convertibles, and all the others reasons for buying a convertible or a non-convertible are equal. Further, I would be silly not to buy a convertible, but not irrational. If I feel like getting my hair cut on Sunday rather than on any other day of the week, then according to Dancy there is an enticing, but not a requiring, reason to do that (p. 105). So it is not true that I ought to get it cut on Sunday. Assuming there are no requiring reasons that favor getting my hair cut on some other day, it would be silly not to get it cut on Sunday but not irrational to fail to. Not all reasons imply prima facie or pro tanto oughts.

Broome thinks otherwise (pp. 39-40). He grants that an enticing reason need not oblige you to A. But he thinks that it does not follow that you are obliged to do A whenever you ought to do A. His view implies that I ought to buy the convertible and get my hair cut on Sunday even though I am not obliged to do either.

Broome and Dancy need not disagree. Dancy could hold that I ought to buy the convertible and get my hair cut on Sunday in the weak sense that I am silly, though not irrational, if I fail to do those things. However, I am not obliged to do either of those things, because that implies that I would be irrational if I failed to do them. And Broome could agree that that is what he means by "ought" and "obliged." You ought, all things considered, to do something if either it would be irrational or silly for you to fail to do it (either condition is sufficient), but you are obliged to do something only if it would be irrational for you to fail to do it (only that condition is necessary). On this view, reasons imply pro tanto oughts, but failing to do what you ought to do, all things considered, does not imply irrationality.

I believe this is the correct answer whether Broome and Dancy accept it or not. However, I do not think it shows that there are two types of reasons or that the so-called "entailment claim" (Ulrike Heuer, "Raz on Values and Reasons," p. 140) is false. We can hold that all reasons imply prima facie or pro tanto oughts, but violating an all-things-considered ought implies different criticisms depending on the strength of the reasons that are the basis of the ought. Particularly egregious failures of reason are deemed irrational while lesser ones are called silly, foolish, and the like. I ought to buy the convertible, and I ought to get its brakes fixed when they are worn. It would be silly but not irrational not to buy it, and silly and irrational not to get my brakes fixed. That it would be fun, exciting, pleasant, etc., to do something is not as strong a reason to do it as the fact that doing it will considerably lower my chances of dying. Hence acting contrary to the first sorts of reason warrants less severe criticism than acting contrary to the second.

Even if reasons to act necessarily imply pro tanto oughts, what are the sources of reasons to act? What makes some consideration a practical reason for someone? Desire-based views hold that there is a reason for S to A if and only if doing A will satisfy a desire that S has, or would now have under certain ideal conditions involving knowledge of the facts and lack of emotional upset (anger, fear, envy, anxiety, etc). Desires are the only sources of reasons for action. In contrast, value- and reason-based views hold that desires are never in themselves reasons for action. On these sorts of view, the fact that I want to eat ice cream does not give me a reason to go to the store to buy some. The reason for going to the store is that eating ice cream would be pleasant or enjoyable, and those mental states are valuable, that is, worth valuing, or they are primitives, considerations that constitute reasons to act but not necessarily because they are worth valuing.

Non-desire-based theories are partly founded on counter-examples to the idea that all desires provide some reason for action. Suppose I want to harm myself for no reason; I do not want to harm myself as a means of bringing myself pleasure or ending my pain, as a way of doing penance for some wrongdoing or of helping others, or because I have promised, etc. Then I have no reason to harm myself–no reason to mutilate, burn, kill, etc., myself, even if I want to do those things. So if a desire to harm myself is not necessarily a reason to act, why is a desire to do something that will benefit myself or others necessarily a reason to act? Isn't it the benefit itself that provides the reason, not the desire to benefit? It seems that the only way to account for the fact that some desires seem to provide reasons for action and some do not is to say that no desire in itself provides such a reason. Rather the reasons are provided by the objects of those desires, not the desires themselves. When the objects are valuable, that is, worth desiring, then people have reason to do what will procure for them those objects; otherwise they do not. The appeal of non-desire-based theories of reasons for action is their ability to explain why some desires seem to provide reasons for action while others do not.

But the non-desire-based theories do not seem able to account for cases in which there are equally good non-desire-based reasons for people to choose any of several options and yet they prefer one of the options over all the others. Ruth Chang writes,

The argument [that affective desires can provide reasons] begins by examining what I take to be the 'Achilles heel' of any value-based views, the case of 'feeling like it' when all other relevant reasons are evenly matched … . 'Feeling like it' can rationalize action when the other relevant reasons for and against having what one feels like are evenly matched. ("Can Desires Provide Reasons for Action?", p. 80; see also p. 85)

She goes on to discuss Buridan's ass cases. Buridan's ass had to choose between eating a bale of hay on its left or its right, where it is assumed that the bales are identical and that eating from either would produce the same amount of pleasure, enjoyment, and nutrition. Chang says that if the ass feels like eating from the bale on its left, then that is what there is most reason for it to do (p. 80).

But isn't this like a case where I am in the supermarket intending to buy a can of tomato soup and just pick one can from among several in front of me at arms reach? When someone asks why I picked the can I did rather than another identical one next to it, it seems appropriate for me to say, "No reason. I just felt like taking this one." Not only did I pick that can for no reason (that is, there was no consideration before my mind that was my reason for choosing that can), there also was no reason for me to pick it over one of the others (that is, there was no consideration that in fact counted in favor of my choosing that can over others). Of course, this need not have been true. I could have picked that can for no reason yet because all the other cans happened to contain salmonella bacteria, there was a reason to pick the can I did even though I was unaware of it.

Chang contrasts Buridan's ass cases with ones where she drums her fingers absent-mindedly on her keyboard or where people without thinking hum a tune while waiting for a red light to change. She thinks that Buridan's ass cases are different because unlike in her examples people in the Buridan examples "have a definite phenomenological attraction to something that draws their attention" (p. 82). So for her if I just arbitrarily pick a can of soup, there would be no reason for me to do what I did. However, if I were attracted to a can of soup because it catches my eye, there would be a reason (Chang discusses the soup case on p. 82).

Suppose I was attracted to that can because the label was printed in brighter colors than on other cans. Assume also that the bright colors are my reason for picking that can. Still, that was not a reason for me to pick it over the others. What I take to be reasons to act (and so what are my reasons for acting) need not in fact be reasons to act, for they need not be considerations that count in favor of my action.

Chang thinks that 'feeling like it' can also provide a reason in cases where the reasons for different courses of action are not evenly matched. She says, "But it is hard to believe that what one feels like is not relevant in a choice between things to eat, places to go, and people to see" (p. 84).

Doesn't the fact that I feel like eating Chinese tonight and not Italian (p. 84) give me some reason to go to a Chinese restaurant? Doesn't Chang's desire to turn a cartwheel (p. 80) give her some reason to turn one? Doesn't the fact that you are attracted to one career rather than another give you some reason to pursue it? "What one feels like," she says, "seems relevant in choices between careers, loves, places to live, and so on" (p. 85).

According to Chang, reasons that are founded on affective desires are not concerned only with trivial matters concerning where to eat or what to wear. They "can provide the most important reasons to do something" and can even outweigh value-based reasons (p. 86).

I might, for example, have most value-based reason to be a doctor, but the fact that I have an affective desire to be a philosopher may give me, all things considered, reason to be one. Having an affective desire for something, then, can make a significant difference to what we have, all things considered, reason to do (p. 86).

Even if Chang seems mistaken about the soup can, that is, even if there is no reason to choose the one that catches my eye, she seems right about other examples: the fact that I am attracted to eating somewhere or some kind of food, or to a career, or to a person, can provide me reason to act in the relevant ways. And insofar as there are convincing counter-examples to desire-based views of reasons for action based on value-based considerations, there is reason to adopt her hybrid view that says that both desires and what has value can provide reasons for action.

However, Tim Scanlon thinks it is puzzling for practical reason to have two distinct sources. The fact that I have promised to do something is a reason to do that thing and the fact that steering my car a certain way will result in the death of an innocent child (p. 231) is a reason for me not to steer that way. These are reasons that I have "whatever ends I have chosen. [There] being reason[s] is something I discover rather than create" (Scanlon, p. 231). The consideration that I have promised and that steering the car this way will kill an innocent child simply have the property of being reasons for doing, or not doing, the relevant things regardless of what my desires or decisions might be. If my choices or decisions sometimes can also create reasons for action, Scanlon thinks the following puzzle arises, "the status of being a reason for an agent is something that a consideration can just have, and also something it can acquire through the exercise of an agent's will" (p. 232).

Scanlon argues that decisions to do things cannot create reasons, though they can make it irrational to do certain things because irrationality for him is a clash between what one judges there is most reason to do and what one in fact does, or decides or intends to do. He argues, "The source of all reasons is independent of the will although the exercise of our wills may sometimes change our situation in ways that change the reasons that apply to us" (p. 233).

To better understand his view, think of the following analogy. I am walking along a beach where every hundred yards there is a pole that has a life preserver hanging on it. It so happens that a person is drowning in the water opposite each pole. Assume that all of these people, P1-P3, are morally decent people and there is no more reason to save one rather than the others. However, I happen to be closest to the first pole opposite which is drowning person P1, and I only have time to save one person. Then I have most reason to save P1 because of my situation, that is, my location on the beach. I should throw P1 the life preserver hanging on the first pole.

Now suppose, instead, that there are three groups of people I can help: G1 = a group of starving people; G2 = a group of people with a serious disease; G3 = a group of people who have been unjustly imprisoned. Suppose, also, that I could help people in either group just as well and just as easily. However, for some reason I feel like helping those with a serious disease and so decide to do just that. Scanlon would say that my decision to help people in G2 did not create a reason for me to do things that will help them because there always was such a reason. Rather, it changed my situation so that after deciding to help them that is what I had most reason to do. In the example of the beach, if I had been nearest the second pole, then I would have had most reason to throw the life preserver on that pole to P2. The change of location did not create a reason to save P2; there always was that reason. It just made that reason apply to me. Similarly, according to Scanlon, my decision to help those with the serious disease did not create a reason to help them; it just made the already existing reason apply to me.

While Scanlon's account might be plausible when applied to certain cases, it is not when applied to others. To modify Chang's example, suppose she could either become a doctor or a lawyer. Suppose she would help as many people and relieve as much suffering in either case, and that both careers would bring the same amount of enjoyment and satisfaction to her. Suppose, though, that she just feels like becoming a doctor and so decides to do that. The fact that going to medical school is needed to become a doctor is not a consideration that just has the property of being a reason for Chang to go to medical school apart from her feeling like becoming a doctor and deciding to become one. So here is an example of some consideration's acquiring the status of being a reason through an agent's desire and will. It is not an example where all along there was reason for her to go to medical school, and it only applied to her once she decided to become a doctor. A reason for her to go to medical school was created by her desire and decision to become a doctor.

Michael Bratman seems to agree with Chang. In "Shared Valuing and Frameworks for Practical Reasoning," (pp. 2-27) he writes, "Raz sees reasons for action as frequently not determining a uniquely rational course of action" (p. 16). Bratman goes on to consider individual as well as shared intentions, plans, and policies that he thinks determine what people treat as reasons, and, I think Bratman believes, actually create reasons for action that were not present before the adoption of those intentions, plans, and policies.

One wonders why Scanlon thinks it is a puzzle that some considerations are reasons for action independent of anyone's will and others are not. There is more than one source of theoretical reasons, that is, of reasons to believe. That I see what appear to be bird droppings on the walk is a reason for me to believe that birds have been perching on the rafters above. That I understand the concept of knowledge gives me reason to believe that it is necessarily true that if a person knows something, then he believes it and it is true. Observation and the understanding of concepts, perception and reason, are two sources of reasons for belief. Why, then, is it puzzling that the fact that I felt like, or decided, to do something can be a reason for action as well as other facts independent of my desires, will, and choices? Perhaps reasons against doing something can never turn into reasons for doing it simply because someone wants to do that sort of thing. For instance, the fact that I want to harm an innocent person cannot make the fact that my action will harm such a person a reason to do it. But why can't what one might call neutral considerations become reasons for action because of desire? That is what seems to happen in many of Chang's examples.

Some desires are worth satisfying just as some promises are worth keeping and some ameliorations of suffering worth doing. Because of this, a value-based theorist of reasons for action should not find it puzzling that practical reasons can have sources independent of the will as well as those dependent on it. Perhaps a necessary condition for a desire to be worth satisfying is that its object not be something not worth having or doing, that is, not something of negative worth. But that should not lead us to think that the value of the object of the desire is the only thing of value. Satisfying a desire for an object that is not of disvalue is also of value. Hence there is a reason to satisfy such desires even if their objects are not valuable. Chang's hybrid view seems plausible: both innocent desires and considerations that make something worth desiring can provide practical reasons.

The essays I've discussed in detail form a connected set having to do with the nature and sources of reasons for action. Other essays are only somewhat related to these topics, and still others introduce different issues. Ulrike Heuer is concerned that if we accept that (1) values entail reasons to act, (2) reasons to act entail pro tanto oughts, and (3) I must consider all the pro tanto oughts that bear on a choice of action if I am to act rationally, then I will never be able to act rationally because there will be too many pro tanto oughts to consider. This is what she calls the "too many reasons problem" (p. 151). She argues for rejecting (2) (pp. 151-52), though I've claimed that we should accept it. My solution is to reject (3), that is, the claim that necessarily, if I am to act rationally, I must consider all the pro tanto oughts. Rational action is a function of what I am justified in believing are the reasons for and against a course of action. It does not require that I consider what are in fact all the reasons for and against a course of action, and so does not require that I consider all the pro tanto oughts. Most of the time I am justified in ignoring many of them.

Two other essays consider the nature of practical reasons. In "Why Am I My Brother's Keeper?", Donald Regan argues for a Moorean view according to which the obligation to help strangers is due to the fact that we should promote good, whether in our lives or the lives of others. Regan's own view is that what is good is "the appreciative engagement of the subject with a worthy object" and that "the subject's pleasure is … an inevitable concomitant, and therefore a sign, of the right sort of engagement" (p. 221). Like Moore, Regan thinks that we should promote good and so, given his view of what is intrinsically good, the appreciative engagement of everyone with worthy objects.

But isn't there also reason to promote what is good for us, where that does not mean simply that there is reason to promote good, period, whether it occurs in our own life or the lives of others? Suppose I have a ticket to hear a performance of the Bach cantata that Regan writes about (p. 221). The ticket will admit either one professor or two students. Assume with Regan that listening to the cantata is a worthy activity. Assume further that the students and I will appreciate the performance equally. If we are our brother's keeper because we have a duty to promote good, then I would be obligated to give the students my ticket. But I am not, even though it would be very nice of me if I did. Somehow what is good for me must figure into what my all-things-considered duty is, maybe as a defeater of what would otherwise be my duty. But then Regan's critique of the coherence of the notion of "good for me" in sec. VIB must be mistaken. (In "Projects, Relationships, and Reasons," Samuel Scheffler makes a similar point against consequentialism, p. 257.)

Once one grants that what is good for us is one basis of practical reasons, the question arises whether reasons based on what is good for us can outweigh the reasons that are the basis of moral obligations. In "The Rightness of Acts and the Goodness of Lives" (pp. 385-411), Ray Wallace's primary concern is to raise, but not to answer, the question of whether being moral might be good for us in the sense that it can make our lives more worthwhile and meaningful. He argues that to enter into a distinctive type of valuable relationship with others requires treating them with respect and that treating them with respect requires being able to justify your actions on grounds that are acceptable to them. At least some contractualists (e.g., Scanlon) think that moral principles are rules for social interaction that no one could reasonably reject. If that is the nature of moral principles, then by acting morally you will be able to ensure that you can justify your actions on grounds that are acceptable to others, i.e., grounds that no one can reasonably reject.

Of course, while one thing most people want is to be able to justify their actions to others, it is not the only thing. Most also want to benefit, and prevent harm to, their families, friends, and loved ones. In situations where morality conflicts with these ends, they might even want to promote those ends more than they want to be able to justify their actions to others. So why should they be moral in those circumstances? Their actions might be more meaningful and worthwhile for them if they did not make the sacrifices that morality requires in such cases. Even if there is a sound argument to show that being moral is good for us, that will not answer the "Why be moral?" question. Even if being moral is good for us, on occasion acting immorally might be even better for us. It might be better for me and my loved ones if I steal the money that has fallen from the back of the armored truck late at night with no one around.

Other essays in this collection are not primarily on the nature of reasons for action. The main topics of several of those essays are: (1) what do plans and policies have to do with what we treat as reasons for action, whether the plans are individual or cooperative (Bratman); (2) does your choosing and actively willing something require that you had a reason to do so (Frankfurt); (3) what is it for an act to be intelligible (Stocker); (4) does reasoning have to rest on starting points that are not themselves judgments (Railton); (5) if personal relationships like friendship always entail certain obligations, why don't commitments to projects or causes (Scheffler); (6) deliberative engagement with others (what one might call genuine deliberation) obligates us to put aside deception, coercion, intimidation, reneging on commitments that result from the deliberation, etc. (see p. 166), but why should we engage in such deliberation and why shouldn't we sometimes act contrary to the obligations it founds (Petit and Smith)? There are two other essays primarily on moral topics alone: (7) doesn't social justice and the value of freedom require us to absorb some of the costs and bear some of the burdens that result from the free choices of other citizens, e.g., those imposed by their religious or family commitments (Schiffrin); (8) what is the difference between simply doing wrong (say, by failing to help the starving) and wronging someone (say, by breaking a promise to her), and why do we owe a duty to others when we do (Thompson)?

I cannot comment on all these essays, but I do agree with Stocker and Frankfurt against Raz regarding the relationship between choices, intelligible actions, and reasons.. Raz holds that an act is intelligible only if it is done for a reason. Further, he holds that an act is done for a reason only if it is done because of some consideration that is seen by the agent to be good, or at least is classified by us as that person's believing the consideration to be good (see Stocker, pp. 304-06). But contra Raz, acts done out of jealousy, hatred, or greed can be intelligible, that is, we can understand why a person committed them, even though neither that person, nor we, believe that the action has any good-making characteristics.

Frankfurt argues that Raz is mistaken to think that choosing and actively willing require that a person have reason for her choice and for what she wills. He finds no argument in Raz to show that choice necessarily involves having a reason (p. 122) and thinks that the explanation of why animals do not choose is that they do not have second-order desires (they lack the capacity to either want or want not to have their desires), not that they do not have reasons for what they do (pp. 123-24). Further, for Frankfurt, to actively will something is to whole-heartedly will it, that is, to identify with one's willing it. This, too, for Frankfurt amounts to having a second-order desire to want the will that you have.

For Frankfurt, a person can be irritated at a friend, and act from that irritation by, say, not inviting the friend to a departmental party, while whole-heartedly identifying with that feeling "without it even occurring to him to ask whether he has any reason for doing so" (p. 127). Hence, having a reason is not necessary for choice and active willing. Further, one might think that one has sufficient reason to feel irritated, and to act on that feeling, yet feel alienated from the irritation and the corresponding act of will because one sees it as being caused by forces beyond one's control. Thus, thinking that one has sufficient reason to feel and do something is also not sufficient for actively willing.

Of course, for Raz, a reason need not occur to a person for her to choose or actively will a thing. All that is required is that the person be "weakly rational," that is, be disposed to respond to reasons as we see them (p. 126). So Frankfurt's putative counterexample against Raz's position must be modified by stipulating that, in the circumstances, the people in the examples are not even disposed to respond to reasons. And contra Frankfurt, surely it is not enough for a person to actively will something that he want to have the desires he has. The heroin addict who wants to want heroin but whose addiction has been produced by others repeatedly injecting him with heroin while he sleeps and without his knowledge, and who is then brainwashed to want to want the drug, does not freely take heroin, does not actively will to take it. Perhaps contra both Raz and Frankfurt, a creature chooses and actively wills something just in case its will is uncoerced (which is different from having second-order desires), it does not believe it has decisive reason against what it wills (which is not the same as having reasons for what it wills), and it has the capacity to respond to reasons (which some animals and young children lack).

Besides the critical comments I have already made, I would only add that I found Michael Thompson's essay too long and hard to follow in places. Seana Shiffrin's piece could have been streamlined, too. Samuel Scheffler's essay is disappointing because he ultimately does not answer the puzzle he poses, namely, why commitment to projects and causes need not entail obligations while personal relationships do. And it would have been better if Jay Wallace had tried to answer, and not just raise, the question of whether being moral might be good for us in the sense that it can make our lives more worthwhile and meaningful. The answer to that question has a direct bearing on the answer to the "why be moral?" question. But these are minor criticisms and mild disappointments. The essays in this collection are by some of the leading figures in the field writing on reasons, values, and morality and are well worth considering.