Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas

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Robert B. Brandom, Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas, Harvard UP, 2009, 237pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674034495.

Reviewed by Mark Okrent, Bates College



Right at the beginning of his exciting new collection of essays, Reason in Philosophy, Robert Brandom announces his allegiance to his own distinctive brand of rationalism: "This book belongs to a venerable tradition that distinguishes us as rational animals, and philosophy by its concern to understand, articulate, and explain the notion of reason that is thereby cast in that crucial demarcating role.“(p 1) That is, according to Brandom we are distinguished from other animals by being rational, and the differentia of philosophy as a discipline is that it attempts to comprehend what it is to be rational and to act for reasons in this differentiating way. In the remainder of this remarkably clear and concise collection Prof. Brandom practices philosophy in just this sense. In the various essays Brandom approaches the key notions of rationality, reasons, having a reason, and acting for a reason from a number of different historical and systematic perspectives and tries to articulate and to apply these notions, so articulated, in a variety of different ways. In the process of carrying out these investigations, Brandom also provides us with the most accessible extant introduction to his complex systematic philosophy.

”NDPRBodyTexT">Who then are we, the rational animals? According to Brandom, the class of rational animals is specified as those beings whose activities are appropriately assessable in terms of what they ought to do:

To be a rational being in this sense is to be subject to a distinctive kind of normative appraisal: assessment of the reasons for what one does — in the sense of ‘doing’ that is marked off by its liability to just that sort of appraisal. Rational beings are ones that ought to have reasons for what they do, and ought to act as they have reason to. They are subjects of rational obligations, prohibitions, and permissions. (p 2-3)

Now, this specific characterization of the class of rational animals — the claim that to be a rational creature is to be subject to assessment in terms of whether or not the one who acts has reasons for his actions and acts as he ought to act given those reasons — is marked by a certain ambiguity. The ambiguity regards the content of those reasons and the assessment of whether or not the agent has those reasons. On the one hand, we might hold that the content is fixed independently of that assessment; alternatively, the fact that the agent is the subject of that sort of normative appraisal can be seen as constitutive of the agent having reasons to act at all and of the content of those reasons. On the first reading, the cardinals in my yard that are currently swarming around my bird-feeder during a snow storm are properly subject to assessment in terms of the reasons for what they do. Their biological nature gives the cardinals a reason to consume stuff that they can digest; that is, they ought to eat the seed. And since they ought to eat the seed, their behavior is appropriately assessed in terms of that norm; they either act as they ought to act as they have reason to or they do not. So, on the first reading, since any agent whose biology fixes the goals of its activity has in that sense a biological reason to act in certain ways, any such agent is assessable in terms of whether or not it acts as it has reason to, and, insofar as that assessment is (or if made would be) positive, in that sense counts as a rational animal. On the second reading, the examples of the types of assessment to which rational agents are subject, given in the last sentence of the quote above, govern the entire criterion. In this sense, only agents who are properly assessable as the subjects of “obligations, prohibitions, and permissions”, that is, only agents who ought to act as they are obliged to act, or ought not to act as they are prohibited from acting or as they are not permitted to act, and whose acts are appraisable as in accordance or failing to accord with those obligations, prohibitions and permissions, count as rational animals. On this reading of Brandom’s criterion, the cardinals in my back yard do not count as rational, because it makes no sense to evaluate them in terms of their success or failure in acting as they ought to act in light of the reasons that they have to act in virtue of their obligations and the prohibitions and permissions that they stand under, since they stand under no such obligations, permissions, or prohibitions.

It is central to Brandom’s kind of rationalism that for him the behavior of the cardinals in my yard does not count as assessable in terms of their reasons; they are sentient, rather than sapient, to use a typical Brandomian turn of phrase. For Brandom, sentient beings, such as the cardinals, react differentially to their environments. But they do not count as sapient because they are incapable of the kind of responsibility and authority for their acts that is characteristic of being obliged, prohibited, and permitted, (and being committed to a certain course of action or entitled to something), and which, on his view, is necessary if an agent’s inferences are to be appropriately appraisable. The cardinals’ behavior amounts to an implicit categorization of the features of their environment, but this behavior does not depend upon the birds performing inferences to or from the applicability of those categorizations. It is his distinctive analysis of the nature of inference and of the practice of drawing and evaluating inferences that forms the core of Brandom’s understanding of rationality. An agent is rational in Brandom’s preferred sense just in case she draws inferences in a way that is evaluable according to the inferential role of the concepts involved in those inferences, where the inferential role of a concept is specified in terms of the conditions under which an agent would be entitled to apply, or prohibited from applying, that concept, together with what else an agent would be entitled or committed to by the appropriate application of the concept. This articulation of the content of concepts in terms of the inferential role of those concepts, and the specification of those roles in terms of proprieties of inference, is combined with a distinctive brand of pragmatism. Instead of the content of a concept providing an independent guide or rule that governs which inferences are appropriate, it is the actual practices of inferring carried out in a community of agents who assess themselves and each other for the propriety of their inferences that explains the content of the concepts. In probably his clearest statement to date of the essentials of the analysis of rationality that forms the core of his program, Brandom sums up his commitments in Reason in Philosophy:

I have emphasized that on my way of understanding it, rationality is a normative concept. The space of reasons is a normative space. I have also registered a methodological commitment … to a pragmatic order of explanation — to accounting for meaning in terms of use; more specifically, to abstracting the inferential relations that articulate conceptual … content from the reasoning practices and inferential processes of discursive practitioners. This is a broadly functionalist explanatory strategy. It is a rationalist (more specifically, inferentialist) functionalism, because conceptual content is understood in terms of its role in reasoning, in the form of inferential role. And it is a normative functionalism, rather than a causal-dispositional functionalism. That is, the roles in question are to be specified in a normative vocabulary of what would commit or entitle one to apply a concept and what else doing that would commit or entitle one to, rather than with what would dispose one to apply that concept or what else doing that would dispose one to do. (p 12)

Roughly half of Reason in Philosophy is devoted to the publication of the three Woodbridge lectures, originally given at Columbia in 2007, in which Brandom offers a daring interpretation of Kant and Hegel on the mind and semantics, the development of those views in the transition from Kant to Hegel, and the relevance of Kant and Hegel to contemporary thought. The remainder of the volume includes five occasional pieces that discuss a variety of topics, from truth and the nature of concepts to the character, importance and role of the philosophic enterprise. Given the disparate aims of the various chapters, there is a surprisingly high degree of unity of tone and content in the collection taken as a whole.

The first of the Woodbridge lectures, “Norms, Selves, and Concepts” offers a distinctive reading of Kant’s theoretical philosophy that is radical in a number of ways and is the most interesting piece in the collection. For Brandom, Kant’s central insight is that "what distinguishes judging and intentional doing from the activities of non-sapient creatures is not that they involve some special sort of mental processes, but that they are things knowers and agents are in a distinctive way responsible for" (p 32). Since Brandom’s Kant also holds that an entity is responsible for its judgments and its acts just in case it is capable of taking responsibility for those acts and judgments, Brandom’s Kant is committed to the view that having a mind is a matter of the minded entity taking responsibility for what it believes and does. Put in slightly more Kantian terms, Brandom’s Kant is committed to the view that the unity of apperception is achieved through a process in which an agent unifies her judgments by coming to believe what she ought to believe (has reason to believe) given her other judgments and the content of the concepts ingredient in those judgments.

From a purely scholarly perspective the interpretation of Kant on offer here is not only idiosyncratic, but also highly selective and under-justified by the text. That the interpretation is idiosyncratic is a function of the fact that on this reading, Kant comes out sounding a lot like Brandom. (To become fully Brandomian, this Kant would at least have needed to read Brandom’s Hegel, but that is a matter for the next two lectures.) The interpretation is selective in that it focuses exclusively on a narrow, though central range of Kantian themes. In particular, Brandom is interested primarily in Kant’s theory of judgment, the transcendental unity of apperception, and, especially, Kant’s suggestion in the A Deduction that the form of a concept is always “something that serves as a rule”. As he himself admits, Brandom’s reading ignores other central themes in Kant’s thought; most importantly Brandom does not discuss intuition or sensibility, nor does he at all integrate Kant’s consideration of sensibility into his interpretation. The interpretation offered in “Norms, Selves, and Concepts” is also based on an exceedingly small number of texts, and sometimes the reading of even those texts is a bit tendentious. (For example, Brandom makes a great deal of Kant’s remark in the B Deduction that traditional theories that treat judgment as a representation of a relation between two concepts can’t handle hypothetical or disjunctive judgments — Brandom sees this as a first insight into the force/content distinction — but, in context, in this passage Kant treats this remark almost as a parenthetical aside.)

Nevertheless, the reading of Kant in “Norms, Selves, and Concepts” is also a powerful and coherent interpretation of Kant that is full of fascinating and surprising insights. And Brandom provides us with a partial justification for this violent reading of Kant in the remaining two Woodbridge lectures, which present the outlines of his interpretation of Hegel and his understanding of the philosophical development from Kant to Hegel. Among other topics, the second lecture, “Autonomy, Community, and Freedom”, treats the question of the nature and origin of the determinateness of the contents of the empirical concepts that we ought to apply responsibly. According to Brandom,

Hegel’s principle innovation is his idea that in order to follow through on Kant’s fundamental insight into the essentially normative character of mind, meaning, and rationality, we need to recognize that normative statuses such as authority and responsibility are at base social statuses. (p 66)

It is not merely the case that to be an agent who is responsible for what she believes and does an agent must acknowledge that responsibility. As Kant saw, it is also the case that that agent must be recognized as standing under that responsibility by other individuals, and that this requirement of mutual recognition allows, in a proto-Wittgensteinian fashion, for the possibility that we might be wrong regarding just what we have committed ourselves to. This possibility is in turn central to the independence of the content of concepts from our own application of those concepts. In the third lecture, “History, Reason, and Reality”, Brandom both completes his discussion of Hegel on the origin of the independent content of concepts and lays out his own views on the importance of Hegel for a proper understanding of the nature and practice of the history of philosophy. Brandom argues that for Hegel the content of all of the concepts that we are responsible for applying in judgments gets fixed in a way that is analogous to the way in which the content of the concepts used in the common law get determined:

The judge must decide, for each new case, both what to endorse — that is, whether or not to take the concept in question and apply it to the situation as described — and what the material incompatibility exclusions and consequential inclusions articulating the content of the concepts are. And for both of these tasks the only raw materials available are provided by how previous cases have been decided. (p 84)

In making these decisions, the judge in the common law tradition and the concept user in general is responsible both to the other contemporary (authorized) users of the concept in question and to the history of the previous uses of the concept; she must submit reasons for using the concept in the way that she does that appeal to those previous uses as justifications and are acceptable to her current, and future, colleagues. In doing so, and responding to other contemporary uses of the concept by either recognizing or failing to acknowledge them as appropriate, each current concept user is situated as part of a contemporary community that is perpetually interpreting, extending, and clarifying the tradition from which the community has arisen by applying to new cases the concepts inherited from that tradition. For Brandom this process is just as much at work in the development of the philosophical tradition as it is in any other sphere. We philosophers do our work by applying the concepts we have inherited to new cases, and in doing so we justify ourselves by appealing to reasons derived from our reinterpretations of our own tradition. And, completing the circle, this is exactly what Brandom holds he is doing in the Woodbridge lectures taken as a whole. From this perspective it is not surprising that Kant and Hegel come out sounding a lot like Brandom (and Sellars and Wittgenstein).

Of the remaining essays in Reason in Philosophy two concern further reflections on the philosophical enterprise, one concerns truth, and two more concern Brandom’s reasons for preferring his own view of the nature of concepts to the alternatives on offer in contemporary discussions. (It should be noted in regard to this last topic that Brandom tends not to consider either all of the alternatives on the table or all of the nuances of alternative views. For example, the distinction, of which Brandom is quite fond, between sentient creatures, who are capable of differential responsiveness, and thus behavior that sorts environmental features into types, but are incapable of inference, and sapient creatures, who have the capacity to form and assess the appropriateness of inferential connections, and are thus capable of applying concepts in the full Brandomian sense, would hardly seem to be exhaustive. While the cardinals in my yard probably don’t assess the propriety of each other’s inferences, they do seem to infer quite a bit that is not present to their sensory sorting mechanisms from the limited sensory information they glean in the course of categorizing their environment.) While all of the issues treated in these chapters have been covered by Brandom, in some cases more extensively, in his other writings, each of these essays also contains interesting new insights that are often expressed in a clear and highly accessible way. They, together with the chapters derived from the Woodbridge lectures, provide both an excellent introduction to Brandom’s thought and a highly readable and important contribution to contemporary debates in philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, and the metaphysics of mind.