Reason, Metaphysics, and Mind: New Essays on the Philosophy of Alvin Plantinga

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Kelly James Clark and Michael Rea (eds.), Reason, Metaphysics, and Mind: New Essays on the Philosophy of Alvin Plantinga, Oxford University Press, 2012, 220pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199766864.

Reviewed by Jim Beilby, Bethel University


The culmination of a long and fruitful career is always something worth celebrating. But some retirement celebrations require a little something extra -- like an academic conference and a book. On May 21-23, 2010, nearly three hundred people gathered to celebrate the career and retirement of Alvin Plantinga. They gathered not only because Plantinga is world-renowned for his contribution to the fields of epistemology, metaphysics, and philosophy of religion, but also because "Al" -- as most of the conference participants know him -- is their friend, mentor, and/or former professor. This volume is a collection of the papers presented at that conference. The topics addressed by the essays are as diverse as Plantinga's own work.

In his essay, "Singular Propositions," Trenton Merricks critically engages metaphysical issues that emerge out of Plantinga's The Nature of Necessity. The brand of modal realism Plantinga defends includes a commitment to the idea that singular propositions have as constituents the objects to which they directly refer. Merricks discusses a range of objections to the 'received view' on singular propositions, including the objections that belief in singular propositions is incompatible with another aspect of Plantinga's modal realism, serious actualism.

Ernest Sosa addresses an important aspect of Plantinga's epistemological work in "Descartes and Virtue Epistemology." Plantinga has famously argued that Descartes was one of the fountainheads of the meta-epistemological position known as Classical Foundationalism and that Classical Foundationalism is self-referentially incoherent. Sosa offers a novel and intriguing argument that Descartes was not a Classical Foundationalist, but instead embraced a version of virtue epistemology. If Sosa is correct, Descartes' epistemological approach bears affinities to Plantinga's own religious epistemology, a point nicely made by Ray VanArragon in his response to Sosa.

In "Causation and the Mental," Peter van Inwagen engages Plantinga's longstanding interest in the philosophy of mind. Plantinga is an unapologetic defender of dualism -- the view that minds are immaterial substances -- and he holds that materialism faces intractable problems accounting for consciousness and intentionality. Van Inwagen addresses Plantinga's critique of materialism by developing a stance on causation that makes it possible to respond to at least some of the most pressing objections to materialism.

Michael Bergmann and Richard Otte each engage aspects of the problem of evil. Since the publication of Plantinga's Free Will Defense, conversation on the problem of evil has shifted from the Logical Problem of Evil (does evil's existence entail God's non-existence?) to the Evidential Problem of Evil (is evil's existence evidence for God's non-existence?) In "Commonsense Skeptical Theism," Bergmann, drawing inspiration from Thomas Reid, extends a particular kind of increasingly well-known response to the evidential argument from evil. The "skeptical theist" argues that we should be skeptical of our ability to discern God's reasons for acting or refraining from acting to stop a particular evil. In "Theory Comparison in Science and Religion," Otte discusses the fascinating and important question of how evidence can be used to support or disconfirm theories or worldviews and applies that discussion to how the 'evidence' of evil might disconfirm Christian theism.

Thomas Flint and Dean Zimmerman tackle different aspects of the thorny issue of God's foreknowledge. In "Varieties of Accidental Necessity," Flint considers the extent to which facts about the past (such as God knowing that X will happen at some future time t) are necessary and as such place constraints upon the freedom of choices by moral agents. Zimmerman's "The Providential Usefulness of Simple Foreknowledge" compares the providential benefit of simple foreknowledge to middle knowledge (Molinism) and a lack of simple foreknowledge (Open Theism).

Eleonore Stump heeds Plantinga's "Advice to Christian Philosophers" and brings the tools of philosophy to bear on an important theological matter, the atonement. In her essay, "The Nature of Atonement," Stump seeks to uncover the interpretive and theological difficulties faced by various theories of the atonement.

The volume concludes with Nicholas Wolterstorff's, "Then, Now, and Al," a fascinating retrospective analysis of the intellectual milieu in which Plantinga began his philosophical career and an eye-witness evaluation of the impact of Plantinga's work. Wolterstorff illustrates not only the profound influence Plantinga has had, but the iconoclastic nature of many of his arguments. The bankruptcy of Logical Positivism and the problems associated with Classical Foundationalism might seem obvious now, but when Plantinga first started addressing these topics, he was walking largely untrodden ground.

The quality of the essays in this volume is very high. They all provide an important contribution to their respective areas of philosophical discourse and some have the potential to be classics. I found Ric Otte's essay, for example, to be profoundly helpful in advancing (and in some ways, redirecting) the conversation about the problem of evil. Furthermore, the distribution of the topics provides an interesting survey of some of the best work in analytic philosophy and analytic theology out there.

The essays in the volume also nicely illustrate the profound impact Alvin Plantinga has had on the field of philosophy. His purely academic achievements were not the only reason for this conference and ensuing volume. Consider the first footnote in Michael Bergmann's essay.

I am very pleased to be presenting this chapter in honor of Alvin Plantinga. His philosophical writings are brilliant, field defining, and full of wit, all of which make them both hugely beneficial and a huge pleasure to read. But even more impressive and meaningful to me, however, is the manner in which he has modeled in his own life, in multiple ways that I think about often, how someone with a career in philosophy can be a faithful Christian (p. 9, n. 1).

Comments such as these, including the whole of Wolterstorff's essay, indicate that Al has not been content to merely blaze new trails in the philosophical landscape. He has shouldered the more difficult task of guide and mentor to many who have followed him on those new trails. This volume appropriately conveys appreciation for his work, both philosophical and personal.

I do, however, have three small quibbles with the volume. First, the issues engaged by the essays are profoundly interesting and the contributors and respondents are all top-notch, so I would very much have liked to have seen more extensive conversations between them. Second, some (but not all) of the essays include a short rejoinder to the comments of the respondent. But this rejoinder is included as a postscript to the original essay and before the response. This is, as I said, a quibble. It is certainly possible to read the essay, skip ahead to the response, and then jump back to the post-scripted rejoinder. But this is unwieldy and unnecessary. Third, not all of the essays include a rejoinder. Bergmann, Flint, Merricks, and Sosa do, but Otte, Stump, van Inwagen, and Zimmerman do not. But, of course, these are not objections to the content of the volume. The problem here is not, one might say, philosophical indigestion. The problem here is analogous to that of Oliver Twist. The philosophical food in this volume is so appetizing that I found myself saying, "Please sir, I want some more."