Reason, Morality, and Law: The Philosophy of John Finnis

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John Keown and Robert P. George (eds.), Reason, Morality, and Law: The Philosophy of John Finnis, Oxford University Press, 2013, 615pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199675500.

Reviewed by Jonathan Crowe, University of Queensland


John Finnis has retired from his post at Oxford and this has led to a great outpouring of books from Oxford University Press. These include a five-volume collection of Finnis's essays, spanning topics in ethics, political philosophy, jurisprudence and theology (2011a), and a new edition of his magnum opus, Natural Law and Natural Rights, including a postscript responding to critics (2011b). The present volume continues this prolific output. It is a collection of essays reflecting on Finnis's contributions to the above fields, edited by two of Finnis's former doctoral students, and concluding with a lengthy response by Finnis himself.

Finnis is one of the leading figures in the revival of classical natural law thinking in ethics and jurisprudence that has occurred since the 1980s. The broadly Thomist version of natural law theory he developed in collaboration with Germain Grisez and Joseph M. Boyle is widely known as the 'new natural law theory', although Finnis disdains the label (468 n. 31). Anyone who is interested in the new natural law theory should check out this book. This is because the range of topics covered in the collection provides an excellent snapshot, for better or for worse, of the central concerns and debates characteristic of the new natural law outlook.

The collection is divided into five parts. The first part, on reasons, goods and principles, reflects upon the structure of the new natural law approach to ethics. This is followed (for reasons I will return to below) by a part dealing with the role of intentions in determining the moral status of actions. The third part, on justice, rights and wrongdoing, turns to questions of political philosophy and bioethics, while the fourth deals with philosophy of law. The final section consists of two essays on the connection between natural law and religion.

This is an imposing book, covering a lot of ground. It made a disheartening thud when it landed on my desk and I gazed upon it balefully for several weeks before summoning the courage to crack it open. The essays are generally of high quality, but one suspects that only a few people will be interested in all of them. Finnis himself is no doubt among this select number, which illustrates the impressive breadth of his philosophical work and interests. I fear I will try the patience of some readers just by mentioning all the chapters, but here we go.

The new natural law theory offers an integrated framework for dealing with philosophical questions in ethics, politics and jurisprudence. The new natural law approach to ethics rests on two fundamental ideas: first, the plurality of the basic forms of good and the associated principles of practical reasoning; and, second, the priority of the good over the right. The new natural law ethics holds that there is a plurality of intrinsic goods, all of which are basic and none of which can be reduced to any of the others. Finnis identifies seven human goods in Natural Law and Natural Rights, although he has since modified his account (cf. 2011a, vol. 3, 88).

The opening two chapters, by Joseph Raz and Roger Crisp, engage critically with Finnis's account of the basic goods, raising questions such as whether knowledge is inherently valuable and the sense in which human goods can be regarded as self-evident. The next two chapters, by John Haldane and Joseph Boyle, reflect more broadly on the philosophical enterprise of reasoning about human goods. Haldane links Finnis's methodology to phenomenological approaches to value and reflects upon its implications for public reason, while Boyle focuses on the role of the 'integral directiveness of practical reason' in what Finnis and his collaborators have termed the 'master principle of morality' (56-7).

The first part concludes with a rather odd chapter by Jeremy Waldron. The chapter raises the interesting question of what is distinctive about natural law approaches to ethics. This question has been widely discussed (e.g., Chartier 2009, 1-31; Murphy 2011; Crowe 2011 and 2014), but rather than engage with this literature Waldron embarks on his own idiosyncratic reflection on the implications of the term 'natural law'. 'Presumably', he remarks, 'we should expect natural law to be law-like. It should be like law' (73).

This suggests, for Waldron, that natural law ethics should resemble positive law. He concludes from this that natural law ethics should be deontic, in the sense of focusing on requirements and prohibitions rather than reasons and goods; it should be capable of being backed by some form of coercion; its requirements and prohibitions should be accompanied by ancillary principles; it should be separable from ethics and morality; and it should gain shared recognition from those individuals whose conduct it is supposed to regulate.

I am not aware of any actual natural law theorist who has applied a similar set of criteria in defining natural law ethics. This does not seem to bother Waldron, who goes on blithely to unpack his criteria and criticise various influential natural law authors, including Finnis, for not adequately meeting them. Why anyone interested in natural law ethics should care about meeting these criteria in the first place, however, is never made very clear.

The new natural law ethics holds that right action consists in fitting responses to the human goods. The first of these fitting responses is participation; the second is respect (Crowe 2011, 300). An agent participates in the basic goods when she makes one or more of them the object of her actions. An agent respects the goods when she refrains from acting inconsistently with their value. It is not necessary that an agent participates in all the goods equally at all times, but she must always refrain from treating them as if they lacked intrinsic worth.

The new natural law theorists hold that it is inconsistent with respect for the basic goods to deliberately harm one or more goods. There is, in other words, decisive reason not to deliberately harm any of the goods, even when doing so might forestall a greater harm or bring about some benefit. This leads Finnis and his collaborators to maintain the existence of absolute duties, such as the duty not to kill an innocent person. A challenge then arises from cases where it seems permissible to cause a harm to bring about some greater good.

The new natural law response to this challenge relies heavily on the doctrine of double effect (DDE). DDE holds that it is sometimes permissible to cause a harm as a foreseen, but unintended side-effect of a reasonable act, although it would not be permissible to intentionally cause the same harm, either as an end in itself or as a means to an end (Crowe 2012, 166-8). It trades, in other words, on a robust distinction between foresight and intention.

This framework unfortunately tends to result in unseemly hairsplitting about intention. Finnis, for example, maintains that a doctor who performs a craniotomy to save the mother's life does not intend to kill the baby (480-5). Now, it is true that the doctor's project is not to kill the child, but to preserve the mother's life. Nonetheless, it strains credulity to say that when the doctor crushes the child's skull, she does not intend the child's death. Surely, if the doctor crushes the baby's skull knowing the baby will die, she kills the baby to save the mother.

Finnis is obliged to say the doctor did not intend the baby's death, because he believes there is an absolute prohibition on intentionally killing innocent people. (The alternative would be to treat the procedure as impermissible, but this is clearly not his view.) This sort of reasoning is explored in the chapters by Luke Gormally, Anthony Kenny and Kevin Flannery, while Cristóbal Orrego examines the overarching issue of how actions should be understood and described. These chapters are clear and careful, but replete with technicalities.

Practical reasoning is sometimes difficult and technical. Nonetheless, I cannot help thinking that all this fine stuff about intention reveals a flaw in the new natural law framework. It is the price Finnis and his collaborators pay for their insistence on absolute moral duties. It's not clear the price is worth paying. Why not say that the duty not to directly harm the basic goods is very robust, but less than absolute? This would yield a more nuanced approach to practical reasoning, while helping to avoid the strained distinctions mentioned above.

The next part of the book is about justice and rights. John Gardner provides a typically subtle discussion of justice, arguing that it is not the only or even the primary virtue we should demand of social institutions, while Matthew Kramer engages sympathetically with Finnis's retributivist theory of punishment. Leslie Green then discusses limited government. He seeks to clarify the various constraints that properly limit government power, distinguishing upstream constraints that hold independently of arguments about the justifications for state authority from downstream constraints that reflect the limits of those justifications.

Green views what he calls the 'limited-government tradition' (188) as focusing on upstream constraints according to which government should always respect a protected sphere of individual autonomy and observe the rule of law. These upstream constraints set rigid boundaries on state action, as opposed to considerations such as effectiveness that depend on downstream investigations concerning the utility of government actions.

Green criticises Finnis's view that government should never take over the formation, direction or management of the local institutions of civil society. Finnis treats this as an upstream constraint on the role of the state, whereas Green argues the emphasis should fall on practical considerations such as effectiveness and efficiency. I am inclined to agree with Green, although I suspect he underestimates the significance of these practical constraints for a normative account of state institutions. He seems to think it is pretty obvious that 'states are massively important institutions with urgent tasks to perform' (194). That's not something we can take for granted if we think states should only act where they outperform other social mechanisms.

Christopher Tollefson's chapter also engages with the issue of limited government, asking what limits flow from the perfectionist orientation of the new natural law view of politics. Tollefson argues that cooperative social groups need a coordinating authority to function effectively (208-9). This echoes Finnis's argument in Natural Law and Natural Rights that social coordination requires 'unanimity or authority. There are no other choices' (2011b, 232). Law plays an essential role, on this view, by authoritatively coordinating social action.

The problem with this argument, as I have pointed out before (2013), is that it overlooks the role of social conventions in solving coordination problems. Many social coordination problems -- including extremely complex ones -- are solved by convention, rather than authority. Language provides an obvious example. It is arguable that many other such problems would also be solved by convention in the absence of a centralised legal authority. Tollefson, like Finnis, seems too ready to take the state's claims to authority at face value.

The next chapter by Jacqueline Tasioulas and John Tasioulas engages Finnis's interest in Shakespeare, offering a jurisprudential reading of Measure for Measure. Patrick Lee then examines Finnis's account of persons as subjects of rights. This is followed by Gerard Bradley's closely argued chapter challenging the framework of legal principles concerning the status of unborn children that has emerged in the wake of Roe v Wade. Bradley's chapter is the first of three dealing with Finnis's contributions to bioethics. Anthony Fisher seeks to show how Finnis's approach to bioethics is grounded in his theory of human goods, while John Keown focuses on Finnis's engagement with issues arising at the beginning and end of life.

The book then moves to philosophy of law. Finnis famously argued in Natural Law and Natural Rights that in order to understand law it is necessary to enquire into its purpose: why should we have laws and legal systems at all? An analysis of the concept of law is therefore an evaluative exercise: it involves identifying and deploying that perspective from which law can best be understood in light of its practical point (2011b, ch. 1). Finnis goes on to argue that positive law that fails in its normative purpose -- to promote the common good -- cannot be considered law in the best and fullest sense of the term. It is legally as well as morally defective.

Finnis's arguments about the essential role of normative ideas in jurisprudence are considered in the chapters by N. E. Simmonds, Timothy Endicott, Timothy Macklem and Julie Dickson. Endicott, for example, engages with Finnis's claim that the central case of law involves the pursuit of certain goods. He argues that, while Finnis is correct about law's pursuit of goods, the distinctive methods law uses to pursue these goods also entail certain ills, such as waste, stupidity, conservatism and bureaucracy (338). This, for Endicott, is the irony of law.

Maris Köpcke Tinturé's chapter shifts the focus to Finnis's accounts of legal and moral obligation. This is followed by a fairly dense doctrinal chapter by Richard Ekins covering Finnis's work on Commonwealth constitutional law. Neil M. Gorsuch then returns to the role of intention in Finnis's theory from a criminal law perspective. The final two essays consider the new natural law theory's relationship to religion and theology. Thomas Pink discusses Catholic doctrine on religious liberty, while Germain Grisez argues that the normative force of natural law ethics is only fully intelligible when placed in the context of theology.

The volume ends with a series of responses by Finnis and a bibliography of his published works. Finnis's responses are careful and thorough: they take up more than 120 pages. The overall aim is very much to explicate and defend the positions set out in his previous writings. There is, perhaps understandably, no sense of urgency to break new ground. Finnis has, after all, spent a long time working with broadly the same set of ideas and methodologies. He is a hedgehog, not a fox. His focus is on patiently sorting through the details.

The collection as a whole has the same general feel of tying up loose ends. It aims more at engaging insiders than winning converts. This conservatism is reflected in the choice of authors. There is an abundance of Oxbridge dons and a plethora of Catholics. There are very few women (only three out of thirty contributors). I would have liked to see contributions from some of the more innovative philosophers working within the new natural law framework, such as Mark Murphy (2001; 2006) and Gary Chartier (2009; 2013), or authors who have engaged with the new natural law theory and then moved beyond it, such as Timothy Chappell (1998; 2009).

The collection could also have benefited from encouraging connections with other views that share common ground with the new natural law position, such as Martha Nussbaum's capabilities approach (2001) or John Mikhail's work on universal moral grammar (2011). As things stand, however, the collection is clearer on the current state of the new natural law theory than its future. I have argued elsewhere that the future of natural law tradition lies in embracing its philosophical diversity (2011), but this book does not reveal a similar vision.

In summary, then, the book contains many examples of clear, patient and technically competent work. It covers an impressive range of topics, reflecting Finnis's diverse interests. There are some valuable reflections on the strengths and limitations of the new natural law outlook. Ultimately, however, the whole thing is a bit too cosy for my liking.


Thanks to Cicely Bonnin, Catherine Carol, Constance Youngwon Lee and Hillary Nye for their helpful comments.


Gary Chartier, Economic Justice and Natural Law (Cambridge University Press, 2009)

Gary Chartier, Anarchy and Legal Order (Cambridge University Press, 2013)

Timothy Chappell, Understanding Human Goods (Edinburgh University Press, 1998)

Timothy Chappell, Ethics and Experience: Life Beyond Moral Theory (Acumen, 2009)

Jonathan Crowe, 'Natural Law Beyond Finnis' (2011) 2 Jurisprudence 293

Jonathan Crowe, 'Does Control Make a Difference? The Moral Foundations of Shareholder Liability for Corporate Wrongs' (2012) 75 Modern Law Review 159

Jonathan Crowe, 'Normativity, Coordination and Authority in Finnis's Philosophy of Law' in Mark Sayers and Aladin Rahemtula (eds), Jurisprudence as Practical Reason (Supreme Court Library Queensland, 2013)

Jonathan Crowe, 'Natural Law and Normative Inclinations' (2014) 27 Ratio Juris (forthcoming)

John Finnis, The Collected Essays of John Finnis, vols 1-5 (Oxford University Press, 2011a)

John Finnis, Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford University Press, 2nd ed., 2011b)

John Mikhail, Elements of Moral Cognition (Cambridge University Press, 2011)

Mark C. Murphy, Natural Law and Practical Rationality (Cambridge University Press, 2001)

Mark C. Murphy, Natural Law in Jurisprudence and Politics (Cambridge University Press, 2006)

Mark C. Murphy, 'The Natural Law Tradition in Ethics' in Edward N. Zalta (ed.), Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2011 Edition) <>

Martha Nussbaum, Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach (Cambridge University Press, 2001)