Reason, Religion, and Natural Law: From Plato to Spinoza

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Jonathan A. Jacobs (ed.), Reason, Religion, and Natural Law: From Plato to Spinoza, Oxford University Press, 2012, 284pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199767175.

Reviewed by Daniel Frank, Purdue University


Jonathan Jacobs has collected a solid group of essays in Reason, Religion, and Natural Law, a volume devoted to the natural law tradition. The scope of the collection is broad, covering Plato, the Stoics, medieval Jewish philosophy, medieval Christian philosophy, and finally Spinoza in the modern period. Historically sensitive, the collection in very large measure displays the creative interplay between natural law and monotheistic religion, and this foregrounds the importance for the topic at hand of Saadia and Maimonides on the Jewish side and Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham on the Christian side.

The volume commences with essays by Fred Miller on Plato's Laws and Jacob Klein on Stoic eudaimonism and the natural law tradition. Plato's political philosophy in his last work is generally taken to be a second-best, but more realistic alternative to that on offer in the Republic. Maybe so, but Miller's focus is on the rationality and divinity of the laws, grounded as they are in nature and the cosmic order, divinely created. This focus provides a manifest continuity between the Republic and the Laws, as both are committed to the rule of reason in the political realm on the basis of a divine foundation. The philosopher-king rules on the basis of an understanding of the cosmos as instantiated by eternal forms, but the laws in the Laws likewise ground rule on the basis of a rationality grounded in the cosmic order. The laws have a divine foundation, and provide the link between political life and its divine foundation. However much the Republic and the Laws differ with respect to who should rule, the manifest grounds for rule is shared. Miller usefully wonders about the motivating force of the laws in the absence of a philosopher-king.

Klein's essay on Stoicism is in its own way a critique of Julia Annas's view of the Stoics' foundation for eudaimonia. Klein sides with those who take the cosmos as a whole, not specific human nature, as the grounds for human flourishing. In this way the Stoics are seen to part company with Aristotle and range rather more closely to Plato, whose understanding of the (divine) grounds for human flourishing in the political realm had been clarified previously in Miller's essay. The natural law tradition begins to emerge from Stoic antiquity as anti-conventional, a universalizing tendency that tends to counter Aristotelian communitarian leanings. Klein, however, is concerned to counter those who find a proto-Kantianism in the Stoics. While the self-sufficiency of virtue is a non-teleological moment in Stoic ethical theorizing, the grounds for their eudaimonism is the natural order, not a moral realm outside the natural order. In collapsing the distinction between nomos and phusis (law and nature), the Stoics are the first to articulate a robust notion of natural law, governing and grounding all who order their lives in accordance with it.

From antiquity the volume turns to the medieval world and its philosophical considerations of the great monotheistic religions. Tamar Rudavsky and Jonathan Jacobs consider medieval Jewish philosophy. Rudavsky's essay is a strong critique of the view of Marvin Fox and those who believe that Judaism does not --  indeed cannot -- have room for the natural law tradition, on the grounds that all the laws depend on God's will alone. As God created the world, so too It created, and thus grounds, the law. So the argument proceeds, but Rudavsky points out that even if the laws are not (merely) conventional, this in no way leaves us with the kind of voluntarism that Fox seems to suggest. However much Saadia and Maimonides differ from each other -- and Maimonides was a vociferous critic of the forebear -- both are in agreement that at least some of the laws are grounded in reason and gain their power to command and to rule in human life on the basis of their rationality. Indeed, for Maimonides, all the laws, at least in their general trajectory, have reasons -- practical reasons grounded in human nature -- and demand obedience on account of their manifest ability to bring about human perfection and happiness. It will be here noted that the monotheistic religions are at one with their Greek forebears in contextualizing the law and adherence to it within a demonstrably eudaimonist trajectory. The 'naturalizing' tendencies of the greatest Jewish philosophers are on display.

Jacobs's essay, in contrast to Rudavsky's, does not find natural law sympathies in the medieval Jewish philosophical tradition. The natural law tradition, hinted at by Plato and articulated by the Stoics, carries with it a commitment to practical rationality to ascertain its own scope and direction. Jacobs, however, argues here (and elsewhere) that medieval Jewish thinkers do not recognize a category of phronesis, practical reason. Rather, the study of Torah and its goal of living life in accordance with (the) tradition take the place of phronesis and its action-oriented goals. For Saadia and Maimonides, the grand project of ascertaining the reasons for the (divine) commandments (ta'amei ha-mitzvot) provides the motivational framework for individual and communal well-being. For Jacobs, this project in no way abets a (mindless) conservative conventionalism, as deep study of the lawgiver's intentions and reasons for the commandments, as well as keen observation of human history and political contexts, enables the student (of the tradition) to gain an insight into the created order and the trajectory of human life. Klein noted that the Stoics collapsed the distinction between nomos and phusis. The medieval Jewish thinkers Jacobs discusses also collapse this distinction (even though there is no idea of "nature" in their tradition). However, they do so in such a way that the result is not a commitment to the governing authority of natural law, but rather to a divine law, eternal but comprehended by humans over time and through study.

Three essays are devoted to medieval Christian philosophers and natural law theory in that tradition. Not surprisingly, Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham are front and center. Anthony Lisska contrasts Aquinas' and Ockham's views of natural law. For Lisska, Aquinas' understanding of natural law, with its affinities to the Stoics and to Roman law, is defensible as a 'realist' gloss of the compelling force of law as grounded in human nature and ascertainable by practical reason. By contrast, Ockham's approach to natural law theorizing is manifestly more "theocentric" and voluntarist, grounded in the divine will and a "thin" (formalistic) conception of the good. Lisska is clearly in Aquinas' camp in this debate, finding in Ockham's natural law theorizing a troubling gap between the grounding of natural law in a robust view of human well-being, and an overly "thin" view of human nature and a justification of the law in the divine will. For Lisska, Ockham's natural law theorizing collapses natural law into divine law and practical reason into a kind of prescriptivism. It should be noted that the medieval Jewish thinkers Lisska previously discussed, Saadia and Maimonides, do not end up in Ockham's camp, though their commitment to divine law is clear: the divine law for them is a starting point for study and practical comprehension, while for Ockham it is final and a determinate ground for obedience.

The collection concludes with two essays on the great heretic of the monotheistic tradition, Spinoza. Jon Miller's essay is nuanced and hopes to counter Curley and Steinberg in their view that Spinoza breaks utterly with the entire natural law tradition as he found it in both ancient and medieval writers. Given Spinoza's critique of divine providence and teleology, it would certainly seem that Spinoza has no grounds upon which to rest classical natural law. Further, his moral subjectivism -- that moral norms (good and bad) have no objective basis -- would also seem to debar him from being accounted a natural law theorist, as traditionally understood. But Miller is intent on understanding Spinoza as some kind of natural law theorist, just as he understands him as some sort of theist. Spinoza does not understand the divine as the deity worshipped by the monotheistic religions, but he still has room for divinity in his understanding of nature as eternal, exceptionless, and never changing. Similarly, Miller, who understands that "Spinoza had a penchant for co-opting tradition" (218), takes Spinoza's non-cognitivsm about moral norms as nevertheless abetting a "quasi-realism" about value because of the uniformity of nature. In this way, Spinoza may be seen as carrying on the Stoic project of finding human fulfillment by living in accord with nature, even while holding that nature is not providentially ordered.

This is a wide-ranging collection, allowing one to see connections over a two thousand year period of philosophizing. What emerges in this journey through the natural law tradition from Plato to Spinoza is the abiding commitment to human reason and its power to secure well-being through living in accordance with a law that is divine in its foundation and yet natural in its connectedness to human nature. Natural law theorists see human beings in a cosmic context, but also understand them as on their own capable of making sense of their particular place in the greater whole. One useful lesson to take away is that the great monotheistic thinkers, such as Maimonides and Aquinas, committed ex hypothesi to creation and to a supernatural divinity, are able no less than their "naturalist" forebears and successors to defend a philosophically plausible view of reason and law that maximizes the role of the former in understanding the trajectory of the latter.