Reason's Debt to Freedom: Normative Appraisals, Reasons, and Free Will

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Ishtiyaque Haji, Reason's Debt to Freedom: Normative Appraisals, Reasons, and Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2012, 270pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199899203.

Reviewed by Derk Pereboom, Cornell University


In his impressive new book, Reason's Debt to Freedom, Ishtiyaque Haji issues a challenge to anyone who is complacent about the compatibility of causal determination with most of our central moral notions. The aim of the book is to show that the existence of objective practical reasons, moral and prudential obligation, rightness and wrongness, intrinsic value, and moral attitudes such as gratitude and forgiveness depends on the availability of alternative possibilities for action. Haji does not commit to whether the alternative possibilities required are of the strong sort incompatible with determinism or of the weak sort compatible with determinism (p. 5). So while his arguments raise difficulties for incompatibilists who hold that the relevant notion of alternative possibility is strong and think that determinism is true, compatibilists may have a way out.

At the same time, Haji contends that his arguments pose a problem for semi-compatibilism (Fischer and Ravizza 1998), which, broadly construed, claims that the central moral notions do not require the ability to do otherwise. Haji concedes, on the ground of successful Frankfurt examples (1969), that blameworthiness and praiseworthiness do not require alternative possibilities, so that it's false that if S is blameworthy for doing A, S could have refrained from doing A. But against John Fischer (2003) he argues that Frankfurt cases do not show that it's false that if S ought to have done A, S could have refrained from doing A. Crucially, Haji contends that Frankfurt cases also do not establish that it's false that if S had an objective practical reason not to do A, then S could have refrained from doing A. And the book aims to show that the rest of the central moral notions are undermined if objective practical reasons are. Thus Frankfurt examples, in his view, don't yield a viable strategy for resisting his conclusions.

This is an important challenge, and Haji is the first to develop it systematically and thoroughly. The arguments of the book are set out with as much clarity as their intricacy will allow. The case Haji makes is an especially strong threat to a view like mine (Pereboom 2001), which favors incompatibilism, allows for determinism, and yet aims to rescue the notions that Haji claims would be undermined. So I will lay out an avenue for response.

One of the central objectives of the book is a defense not only of the 'ought' implies 'can' (OIC) principle, but also of the more controversial 'ought' implies 'could-have-refrained' correlate. More exactly, often defenders of OIC maintain what Haji would think of as an asymmetry. They affirm:

1. 'S ought to do A' implies 'S can do A'

2. 'S ought not do A' imples 'S can refrain from doing A,'

while they deny

3. 'S ought to do A' implies 'S can refrain from doing A'

4. 'S ought not do A' implies 'S can do A.' (p. 33)

Dana Nelkin (2011), for example, endorses this asymmetry. Haji, however, defends not only (1) and (2), but also (3) and (4). In addition, he links the notion of wrongness to obligation with the following principle: S ought not do A if and only if it is wrong for S to do A. A consequence is that 'wrong' implies 'can': it is wrong for S to do A only if S can do A.

Forging the link to objective practical reasons, Haji contends that not only is it the case that if S has an objective pro tanto reason to do A, then S can do A, but also if S has an objective pro tanto reason to refrain from doing A, then S can do A. This is so because 1- 4 are all true, and having reasons is tied to 'ought' judgments. Haji puts it this way: "obligation is conceptually tied to reasons. If an agent has a moral obligation to do something, then she has a reason to do it." (p. 235) In his view, because this connection holds, our having objective pro tanto reasons will be threatened by determinism. The other moral notions will then also be jeopardized. Take forgiveness, for example. Haji endorses the following claim: Necessarily, if S forgives T for something, then S has an objective pro tanto reason -- being willing to cease to regard the wrong done to S as a reason to weaken or dissolve the relationship -- to forgive T. But then, if determinism is true and rules out the relevant sorts of alternative possibilities, no one has such a reason, and so forgiveness is ruled out (p. 123).

As Haji points out, proponents of 1 and 2 who are also deniers of 3 and 4 sometimes recruit our sense of fairness to support the asymmetry (e.g., Copp 2008). It seems unfair to judge that someone ought not do something she can't refrain from doing, but it doesn't seem unfair to judge that someone ought to do something she can't help but do. To rebut this, Haji adduces a case in which it's unfair to punish an innocent person, but we still ought to do so, and so fairness and obligation come apart. In response, it's still prima facie unfair to punish an innocent person, and, correlatively, it's prima facie unfair to judge that someone ought not do something she can't refrain from doing. But it's not prima facie unfair to judge that someone ought to do something she can't help but do. Haji does make the plausible point that what's fair and unfair about such judgments depends (metaphysically) on the control requirements for what one ought to do, and not vice versa (p. 37). But still, this doesn't rule out using our intuitions about fairness as evidence about the control requirements that govern 'ought' claims. Haji also considers counterexamples that illustrate the principle under scrutiny. For instance, it would seem true that you ought to feed your child, but you can't refrain from doing it. It's prima facie odd to conclude that given these circumstances, the 'ought' judgment is false. My sense is that the strength of Haji's case depends the theoretical elegance and symmetry of accepting not only 1 and 2 but also 3 and 4 and that this is how he himself sees it (pp. 47-51). My intuitions go against Haji on this controversy. But when I recently asked my undergraduate class of 70 students about this, a majority favored his line, which makes me curious about what's going on.

A potential route to avoiding the problems Haji raises is to deny OIC, and this has been attractive to compatibilists (Fischer 2003; Graham 2011). Fischer (2003) has argued, for example, that Frankfurt cases successfully challenge both the principle of alternative possibilities for blameworthiness (PAP-B) and OIC. I agree with Fischer that these cases successfully challenge PAP-B, and one might expect that anyone who has this view would also think that such cases undermine OIC. If Jones in Frankfurt's example is morally responsible for killing Smith despite his inability to refrain from doing so, wouldn't it also be true that he ought not have killed Smith despite his inability to refrain from doing so? But my sense is that Haji is right to argue that Frankfurt cases don't also undermine OIC. Nelkin (2011) convinces me that when we say to Jones: "you ought not have killed Smith" the 'ought' invoked requires that Jones could have refrained for the judgment to be true. This is because a judgment that invokes this 'ought' directs the agent to refraining from A at a particular time when the judgment is prospective, and when it's retrospective it presupposes that the agent was directed to refraining from A at t. If the agent can't refrain from A at t, then a condition for the 'ought' claim correctly applying is not met. My intuitions about Frankfurt cases make me think that judgments of blameworthiness do not similarly direct agents to actions or refrainings, and so an agent's being blameworthy for an action does not require that she could have refrained from performing it.

Alternatively, one might question whether objective reasons are in fact closely connected with obligation. Haji says: "If an agent has a moral obligation to do something, then she has a reason to do it." (p. 235) This is, however, just a one-way connection. It's plausible that "if one ought to do something from the perspective of objective reasons, then one can do it" (p. 19ff), and that therefore the "reasons-wise 'ought'" implies 'can.' But is it also credible that whenever S has an objective pro tanto reason to do A, there will be some tie of that reason to obligation? Haji points out that if S has an objective pro tanto reason to do A, and that reason is not outweighed by objective pro tanto reasons to refrain from A, then S ought to do A. Yet S can also have an objective pro tanto reason to do A that is outweighed. This provides support for the claim that it's possible to have such a reason that's not tied to obligation. Perhaps one might have an objective pro tanto reason to do A in virtue of A realizing some good, and that good would be independent of any deontic notion (Vilhauer 2008: 124; cf., Norcross 2006).

C. D. Broad (1952) proposed that one way of saving 'ought' judgments from determinism involves distinguishing senses of 'ought,' and arguing that at least one important sense does not imply 'can' in such a way that determinism would be a threat to it. I propose that while there is a core sense of 'ought' that does imply 'can' in this way, there is another that doesn't, and this other sense of 'ought' -- which is not a notion of obligation -- is tied a robust notion of objective pro tanto reason. This other sense also promises to allow for the rescue of the various moral notions Haji contends would be undermined.

It's standard to differentiate between 'ought to do' and 'ought to be' claims (e.g., Humberstone 1971; Harman 1977; Haji 2002: 15). For instance, Mark Schroeder (2011) distinguishes the action-related deliberative sense of 'ought', and the evaluative 'ought', as in 'Larry ought to win the lottery' where Larry has been subject to a series of undeserved misfortunes. Kate Manne (2011) argues -- plausibly to my mind -- that the evaluative 'ought' also applies to actions. She proposes that an evaluative 'ought' claim does not (at least directly) entail a 'can' claim, even when it concerns an action, while an 'ought to do,' which expresses a demand of an agent in a particular circumstance, does entail that she can perform the indicated action. We might call this last type an 'ought' of specific action demand.

Given determinism and that determinism precludes alternatives, when one tells an agent that he ought to refrain from performing some action in the future, the 'ought' of specific action demand isn't legitimately invoked, but the 'ought' of axiological evaluation still can be. Such a use of 'ought' proposes to an agent as morally valuable a state of affairs in which he refrains from performing the action and recommends that he not perform it. We might call this the 'ought' of axiological recommendation. It is important to stress, however, that this is not an 'ought' of moral obligation. However, such a prospective use of 'ought' is not at odds with determinism. Imagine it turns out that the agent performs the action anyway. If there was good reason to believe in advance that the agent has or could develop the requisite motivation, and especially if there was good reason to think that articulation of the 'ought' judgment would contribute to producing it, this use of 'ought' would still have been legitimate. The 'ought' of axiological recommendation is tied to an epistemic sense of can, i.e., to the condition that it's open that the agent will or can act in accord with the 'ought' recommendation (Kapitan 1986; Vilhauer 2008). The following principle specifies the connection: if it is appropriate for an appropriately situated agent T to tell S that he ought, in the sense of axiological recommendation, not perform actions of A's type, then it is open for T that S will, in the future, refrain from performing actions of A's type.

My sense is that there's a robust notion of objective reason linked to this sense of 'ought' and to the condition that involves the epistemic sense of 'can.' Suppose that if I gave to Oxfam it would feed hungry people. It's epistemically open to me that I will give, even though because I believe determinism is true it's also epistemically open to me that I will be causally determined to refrain from doing so, whereupon it would be the case that I cannot (in a pertinent metaphysical sense) give. In this situation its being epistemically open to me that I will give to Oxfam is sufficient for me to rationally consider the good resulting from my giving to Oxfam to be a reason for me to do so. This would seem to be an objective pro tanto reason -- my giving would really make people better off. It's also tied to 'ought' judgments, albeit not to those of obligation and specific action demand, but rather to those of axiological recommendation. Thus it's also a notion of objective pro tanto reason we can take into account in deliberation.

I'm hoping this line will work. Even if it does, Haji's book is highly valuable because it issues a challenge that prompts its targets to clarify and develop their views. But it may also be that Haji is right, and if so, he is correct to judge that we might well be in deep trouble.

Thanks to Ishtiyaque Haji for valuable comments on a draft of this review.


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