Reason, Tradition and the Good: MacIntyre's Tradition-Constituted Reason and Frankfurt School Critical Theory

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Jeffery L. Nicholas, Reason, Tradition and the Good: MacIntyre's Tradition-Constituted Reason and Frankfurt School Critical Theory, University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 226 pp., $38.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268036645.

Reviewed by Georgia Warnke, University of California, Riverside


Jeffery L. Nicholas is interested in what he calls a substantive conception of reason, a reason that is tradition-based, non-formal, non-instrumental and capable of undoing modernity's differentiation of scientific, moral and aesthetic spheres of rationality. In positive terms, substantive reason grounds a critical theory of society and enables emancipatory projects. Nicholas's elucidation and defense of his view comprises a critique of subjective reason that relies on Max Horkheimer's work, a criticism of Jürgen Habermas's communicative reason, and an explanation of substantive reason that looks to Alasdair Macintyre.

In introducing his concerns, Nicholas points to the lack of ethical deliberation or moral discussion in various domains. Michael Jordan as a spokesperson for Nike thinks the question of sweatshop labor is not pertinent to his job; pilots involved in bombing Baghdad at the start of the war in Iraq claim they were just following orders. Nicholas concedes that some citizens do criticize and evaluate the policies of their firms and countries. "Yet," he continues,

these critiques lack both substance and force. They lack substance because they do not arise from a shared vision of right and wrong or a shared sense of community and justice and they lack force because they cannot appeal to shared standards of reason that might motivate change.

The reason these critiques cannot appeal to a shared vision or shared standards of reason is that "they arise from a reason that has fettered itself by reducing all value to self preservation" (5).

This reason is subjective reason. Whereas objective reason aims at an objective order in terms of which action ends can be evaluated, Nicholas follows Horkheimer in arguing that subjective reason devolves into formal and instrumental rationality. Formal rationality denudes reason of content while instrumental rationality directs it towards pre-given ends, or more precisely, to the pre-given end of self-preservation.

Formalization strips rationality of the ability to judge goals as worthwhile in themselves apart from subjective interests -- this is, the interest of self-preservation; instrumentalization harnesses rationality to any given goal and promotes the principle of self-preservation above all other ends (38).

The first Gulf War is an example: "The Gulf War was fought not for the freedom of people in the region but over oil. Liberalism aligned itself with the interest of oil because it served the self-interest of the people who constituted the liberal democracies that fought the war" (43).

Nicholas does not think Habermas's communicative reason solves the problem. In his attempt to uncover the rational basis of communication oriented to understanding, Habermas may point to the implicit guarantee speakers make to justify the validity claims to truth, rightness and sincerity inherent in their speech acts and to discourses in which these claims are challenged and possibly redeemed. Nevertheless, communicative reason falls short, Nicholas thinks, because it is itself unable to evaluate ends. Hence, although it may expand reason beyond instrumental rationality, it fails to attack and, in fact, takes up the formal side of subjective reason. Nicholas also argues, here following Charles Taylor, that the distinction Habermas makes between the right and the good or between morality and ethics cannot hold. Rather, socialized as we are in particular ways and holding particular conceptual resources and presuppositions, our particular conceptions of the good life necessarily condition our concepts of justice and morality. Likewise, Nicholas thinks Habermas's "formality belies a certain standpoint" (87). What Habermas assumes to be a formal and procedural account of reason is simply unaware of its own commitments in making its highest goal that of coming to an understanding.

Chapter three of Nicholas's book turns to MacIntyre and to his account of a tradition-constituted reason. For MacIntyre a tradition is an argument extended through time in which certain fundamental agreements are defined and redefined both by those inside the tradition and in communication with those outside of it. Reason refers to "the standards of justification and exemplars of reasoning within a tradition" (98). Nicholas is not happy with the minimalist standards of justification and exemplars of reasoning of modern philosophers and philosophies. Nor is he happy with non-cosmological languages or, in other words, languages that have shed their commitments to certain beliefs and ways of life. Cosmological languages may be incommensurable. (By incommensurable, Nicholas means that the standards of justification peculiar to one tradition appear unreasonable when translated into another. He thinks the philosophies of Aristotle, Hume and Kant are incommensurable on these terms.) Nevertheless, non-cosmological languages such as modern English are in worse shape because they hold both a "dearth and a plethora of standards of reason to which to appeal." On the one hand, a non-cosmological language incorporates all standards of reason; on the other hand it is committed to none. Hence, non-cosmological language speakers "starve: they cannot reason because they have been deprived of the very commitments that make rationality possible."

Fortunately, according to Nicholas, we can avoid this predicament by locking onto a "genuinely emancipatory substantive reason" (125). This concept of reason takes off from MacIntyre's tradition-constituted reason but unites it more completely with a conception of the good. The final chapters of Nicholas's book are devoted to spelling out this option. Substantive reason is a set of social practices that involve "thinking about and acting on the set of standards and beliefs of a particular social order." This set involves "standards and exemplars of reasoning" that "constitute an element of the tradition" and "are informed by other aspects of the tradition including the values and symbolic generalizations, the general social practices and ways of life and the larger cosmology" (125-6). This cosmology includes a view of what is good and evil (132) and all these factors are interrelated. For instance, a tradition's conception of the good establishes the appropriate ways of life. Likewise a tradition's conception of the good is "the conception of the best that a human being can achieve given a particular understanding of human nature" (143). In this way, substantive reason provides for the evaluation of ends. We escape from subjective reason, Nicholas argues, when we engage in concrete social practices and traditions and pursue goods defined not by our own interests and desires but by practices and traditions.

Although substantive reason is thus relative to a tradition, it eschews relativism. Here Nicholas cites MacIntyre's account of epistemological crises. Members of a tradition can find that they are unable to resolve certain issues within its parameters. According to Nicholas, they may then look to another tradition but if they are to take its standards of reasoning seriously, they must "learn" it as another first tradition. Despite a passing reference to Gadamer, Nicholas does not think a tradition can provide resources for understanding another and suggests that we must rather move from one into the other. We can then look at our original tradition from the point of view of the other and resolve the issues we could not resolve from within it.

Nicholas does not attempt to offer deep or novel interpretations of Horkheimer, Habermas or MacIntyre. Indeed, some readers may question his readings of them: is it the case, for example, that Habermas thinks that coming to an understanding is our highest aim or is it rather the case that he thinks it is a requirement of coordinating action? We might also read Nicholas's vignettes and examples somewhat differently than he does. He maintains that subjective reason is inadequate because it cannot evaluate ends and because it differentiates spheres of rationality. Nevertheless, his vignettes and examples suggest that he does not really want to de-differentiate spheres of rationality so that questions of etiology, for example, become indistinguishable from questions of evil or standards of morality become the same as standards of beauty. The vignettes and examples are perhaps better characterized as stories of people who are not concerned with the morality of their actions than as stories of people who cannot be so concerned because of the differentiation of rationality spheres.

Moreover, if subjective reason cannot evaluate ends or cannot evaluate them with sufficient substance and force, what are we to do? Is Nicholas asking us to find a tradition and commit ourselves to its ends and standards of reason? If so, and if we pick different traditions from one another, will the problem with which he begins his book not continue? That is, will we not continue to lack the "shared vision of right and wrong" and the "shared standards of reason" that robbed our evaluations of ends of their substance and force in the first place? At times, Nicholas suggests that we already do inhabit a tradition, that of subjective reason. The problem is that this tradition is inadequate, so mired in an epistemological crisis that we must look for another. But if we cannot solve our problem if we opt for different traditions, should we all become, like him, Thomistic-Aristotelians? On his view becoming a Thomistic-Aristotelian will require us to learn the tradition from bottom up as natives. Reason, Tradition and the Good does not try to help us with this task. Nevertheless, Nicholas does suggest that his future work will fruitfully bring the Thomistic-Aristotelian tradition to bear on the issues with which the early Frankfurt school was concerned: domination, the critique of ideology and commodity fetishism. Perhaps this future work, then, will help us make the transition.