Reason, Truth, and Reality

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Dan Goldstick, Reason, Truth, and Reality, U. of Toronto Press, 2009, 337pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802095947.

Reviewed by Peter Tramel, USMA, West Point



In Reason, Truth, and Reality, Dan Goldstick defends a “pre-Kantian rationalism”, which he employs in arguments for primarily metaphysical and ethical positions. In metaphysics his effort culminates in arguments for universal impermanence and continuous deterministic causality. In ethics, utilitarianism. As he assembles the pieces of these complex, culminating arguments, he also discusses topics in the philosophies of language, science, and mind.

This book often draws on arguments from the author’s previously published papers on an impressive variety of topics. However, it is not a collection of these papers, and he offers much argumentation for the first time.

Goldstick divides the book into three parts. In Part I, “Introductory”, he articulates and defends his rationalism. In Part II, “On the Canons of Induction”, he argues that the rational grounds of induction are a priori principles. He then argues that these principles imply universal impermanence and continuous deterministic causality. In Part III, “On the Canons of Morality”, he employs his rationalism in a theory of conscience and, ultimately, in an argument for utilitarianism. He also includes two appendices, one on tautology (which he uses synonymously with analyticity) and the other on desire. The second sheds light on several matters discussed in Part III.

In Part I Goldstick provides an account and defense of his pre-Kantian rationalism. It is a rationalism because it endorses some synthetic “a priori truths”. It is “pre-Kantian” not in virtue of any strong resemblance between the content of those truths and ones endorsed by Descartes, Spinoza, or Leibniz, but rather in virtue of their facticity as truths. Insofar as they are truths they unqualifiedly mean what they say and are thus about reality — ding an sich reality — not mere phenomena, as in Kant’s transcendental idealism. (The book concludes with some general remarks deploring the “intellectual evasiveness” of views like Kant’s.)

A key to Goldstick’s rationalism, and indeed all of the main arguments in the book, is his conception of M-implication: "a statement p will ‘M-imply’ any statement q whose logical contradictory is impossible to assert without contradiction in conjunction with p" (23). Hence the person in Moore’s Paradox, who says: “It is not raining outside, but I believe that it is.” contradicts himself by M-implication. For what that person says M-implies that it is raining outside.

Another key is "proof ad hominem", in the sense that Aristotle appeals to it concerning the principle of non-contradiction. We cannot escape belief in the principle of non-contradiction. The practices of people who deny it suggest that they are confused or victims of false consciousness, like the person in Moore’s Paradox. Yet we can give no non-circular argument for it, since, for instance, to appeal to its analyticity would be circular. Although we can tell a good evolutionary story about why we believe the principle, any attempt to derive it from the observations in that story would have to be inductive or deductive, and so, again, circular. Since we cannot escape believing the principle, we are invariably committed to it, and, importantly, therefore its M-implications, as a priori truths. Although the principle of non-contradiction is an analytic a priori truth, this discussion of proof ad hominem sets the stage for how the author will conceive synthetic ones. Generally, in subsequent discussions the author dismisses skepticisms on the basis of some combination of proof ad hominem and M-implication.

The remainder of Part I is concerned with a “preliminary assault on … empiricism”. Empiricism is conceived as denying that there are synthetic a priori truths, and the author criticizes some of the empiricist views of Carnap, Wittgenstein, Berkeley, and others.

In Part II Goldstick begins by considering the problem of (the rational warrantability of) induction. He argues that deductive warrant for induction is impossible. While he has more sympathy for those, like Mill, who argue for the inductive warrantability of induction, he argues that in order for them to succeed in avoiding circularity, their argument must at some point appeal to a priori principles.

He argues that this case is like that of the principle of non-contradiction: we cannot escape our reliance on induction in ways that at least M-imply (for us) its rational warrantability, and yet we cannot give non-circular arguments for its rational warrantability. We must appeal to a priori principles. Only this time no analytic a priori principles are available; we must appeal to synthetic a priori truths.

Goldstick provides an account of features of induction that a satisfactory rational warrant for it would have to preserve, and he argues that two kinds of synthetic a priori truths are sufficient for the job. The first kind are certain “a priori probabilities” and the second is a principle of simplicity. An a priori probability is “the value which … [something’s] … probability would still have in the event no empirical evidence were available” (121). Goldstick argues that such probabilities are only possible when the reference class in the conclusion is restricted, in terms of its scope and description, since in the long run every combination of possibilities will occur. According to his a priori principle of simplicity, “Among conflicting hypotheses alike consistent logically with all the available observational data, the simplest hypothesis, other things being equal, is the likeliest to be true” (175).

In by far the most complex, challenging part of the book, Goldstick argues that these synthetic a priori principles, which are sufficient to rationally warrant reliance on induction, imply universal impermanence and continuous deterministic causality. Indeed, he argues that determinism is “incontrovertible”. Universal impermanence is the view that nothing lasts forever and everything possible eventually occurs. The argument for this is primarily based on his view of how and why we must limit the reference classes of inductive conclusions in order to get a priori probabilities. Goldstick employs his theory of a priori probabilities and his principle of simplicity, as well as his universal impermanence thesis, in his argument for continuous deterministic causality. He also relies on the view that causes must be in space, which he briefly defends by arguing that non-spatially-located causes are inconceivable, according to a theory of conceivability he briefly outlines.

In Part III Goldstick uses his strategy of "proof ad hominem" and M-implication against moral skepticisms: subjectivisms, error theories, egoisms, and noncognitivisms; or, to put these respectively in his parlance: skepticisms, nihilisms, pragmatisms, and decisionisms. When it comes to ethics, however, skeptics have more options than in the matters treated in Parts I and II. Besides confusion or false consciousness, they can be guilty of “consciencelessness”. However, Goldstick thinks that for most of us consciencelessness is psychologically impossible.

Relevantly, to have a conscience is to have desires of a certain kind: to have an “ensemble of moral pro-attitudes and con-attitudes”. For any such attitude to be moral, it must be a desire that something ought to or ought not to be done by everyone in the same circumstances. The desire must be dogmatic in a certain sense, and it must censure every case in which someone, not least the one who possesses it, allows a non-moral desire to overcome it and determine action. Also, having any such desires commits one to a desire to be morally perfect and a belief that one should be morally perfect. Moral desires are also moral beliefs (or imply supervening moral beliefs) Goldstick interestingly argues, and the true ones are synthetic a priori truths, according to his familiar style of arguing for cases of aprioricity.

Goldstick argues that moral desires involve sympathy in a way that, in combination with their universality, commends (roughly) agent-neutrality, although he does not call it that. In his initial discussion of utility, he replies to a number of familiar objections to utilitarianism and endorses indirect utilitarianism — e.g., acting according to rules themselves derived from broad application of the principle of utility. He briefly defends a hedonistic conception of utility, and he provides discussions of pleasure comparison and ideal utilitarian population.

Goldstick’s argument for utilitarianism builds on the assumption that there are moral truths, in combination with eight other premises that he claims are analytic. However, the conclusion does not fall straight out of the premises. Instead, he employs them to argue that if U was an ideal utilitarian — i.e., roughly, if U feels everyone’s desires at least as strongly as they do and infallibly acts according to the principle of utility — then U would have a conscience without reproach. Goldstick does not argue against the possibility that ideal adherents of other moral theories can have consciences without reproach.

The style of this book is often lively and engaging, despite the difficulty of the subjects and the sweep of his view. Goldstick even seems to notice and poke fun of his penchant for persuasive definition in the closing sentence of Part II. Except where the arguments are particularly complex, the book is highly readable. However, readers familiar with recent work on some of his subjects must be particularly attentive to his usages, which tend to be either dated or unique.

Readers seeking engagement with state of the argument work in epistemology or relevant metaethics will be largely disappointed in those respects. Many epistemologists will have suspected that already, on the basis of the author’s emphasis on “a priori truth”. They will find in the book no serious attempt to distinguish what is epistemic from what is metaphysical in that phrase, nor any careful account of its epistemic credentials or association with defensible systematic theories of warrant or knowledge. Similarly readers seeking engagement with recent work on the theory of practical rationality will find little of what they are looking for, although they will at least find interesting claims and arguments relating to those topics, perhaps especially in Goldstick ‘s account of desire.

Goldstick’s book has a good deal to offer in terms of engaging, original criticism and argument, and in terms of its large, interrelated views of rationalism, induction, metaphysics, and ethics.