Reason, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes from the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr.

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Mark Timmons and Robert N. Johnson (eds.), Reason, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes from the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., Oxford University Press, 2015, 311pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199699575.

Reviewed by David Sussman, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


This is a collection fourteen original papers inspired by the work of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., one of the foremost figures in contemporary Kantian ethics. It begins with a critical analysis by Hill's classic "Servility and Self-Respect," where he argues that servility is fundamentally a failure to properly understand or value one's own rights. In "Servility and Self-Respect: an African-American and Feminist Critique" Bernard and Jan Boxill contend that with his well-known examples of the Self-Deprecator, the Deferential Wife, and the Uncle Tom, Hill is really presenting us with cases that we naturally understand, despite Hill's stipulations, as people merely feigning servility to cope with relations of domination. The Boxills argue that such strategies are much more typical of apparent servility than a failure to appreciate one's rights. If so, then what is usually needed is not moral instruction, but a dismantling of the underlying structures of domination. However, the Boxills do not deny the possibility or analysis of the sort of servility Hill considers, and so their disagreement with him seems more sociological than philosophical.

In "Humility, Arrogance, and Self-Respect" Robin S. Dillon extends some of the themes from "Servility and Self-Respect," asking whether the Kantian really should consider humility a virtue. Dillon contends that while arrogance is indeed a central Kantian vice, humility is not really its proper antithesis. Dillon argues that humility, insofar as it involves a systematic undervaluing of one's self, is really just the flip-side of arrogance. For her, the true opposite of arrogance is the self-respect that neither exaggerates nor downplays one's importance as a person. Even so, Dillon manages to find a space for a kind of admirable humility that lies in evaluating oneself in comparison not with other people, but only with the demands of the moral law itself, relative to which we will always come up short. Yet such humbling will always also be accompanied by a moment of elevation, insofar as we are recognizing the moral law as our law, by and for us, which thereby expresses and constitutes our basic nature as autonomous agents.

Stephen Darwall concludes the first section with "Respect as Honor and as Accountability" which explores how "recognition respect" differs in the context of honor cultures from modern conceptions of dignity. Building on themes from The Second-Person Standpoint, he argues that honor and dignity both involve a conception of the standing that agents have to hold each other accountable. Yet honor is at home in hierarchical forms of ethical life. Darwall contends that unlike dignity, honor is wholly constructed by reference to our social roles; to "lose face" in whatever ways one's honor code prescribes is really to lose one's honor, and not merely the appearance of it. He concludes that as such, disputes around honor concern the maintenance of various pretenses, as in a duel, while dignity disputes instead take the form of an "inquiry" after a truth that may go beyond all appearances, best modeled on juridical proceedings.

The second section turns to issues of practical reason. In "Hypothetical Imperatives," Mark Schroeder revisits the question of just how to understand the requirement to will the necessary means to our ends. In "The Hypothetical Imperative," Hill had interpreted this demand as a universal requirement with a disjunctive object: either to take the means to one's ends or give up those ends. Schroeder contrasts this "wide scope reading" with three other variants, including his own favored "narrow scope" view where an agent with some end has a (non-disjunctive) rational obligation simply to takes the necessary means. Schroeder helpfully clarifies the issue by introducing a distinction between the compliance conditions of a principle and its "jurisdiction," much like the difference between the content of a statute and the background norms that specify where it applies. Schroeder reformulates the dispute between wide and narrow scope readings as a question about whether the instrumental principle should be conceived as a principle with universal jurisdiction (and disjunctive compliance conditions), or as a principle with a purely personal jurisdiction (and non-disjunctive compliance conditions). Finding the idea of universal jurisdiction puzzling (despite its place in international law), Schroeder concludes that the seemingly universal requirement to take the means to our ends is really just a feature of the supposedly less mysterious power to commit ourselves to actions.

Jonathan Dancy's "More Right than Wrong" explores W. D. Ross' notion of a merely prima facie duty. Although Dancy sees Ross are introducing something like the idea of a moral reason, he criticizes Ross for failing to make sense of how such considerations "contribute" to our all-in judgments of duty. The central difficulty seems to be that the various prima facie duties vary by degree, but the property of being all-in right or wrong does not. Dancy advances a "buck-passing" view of rightness where for an act to be right is just for there to be decisive moral reason in its favor, all things considered. He contends that Ross could have availed himself of such a buck-passing view if he had accepted the possibility of there being various degrees of rightness, rather than maintaining that every obligatory act is obligatory to the same extent.

In "Autonomy and Public Reason in Kant," Onora O'Neill considers how Kant's understanding of autonomy and his related conception of public reason differ from the approaches of Rawls and Habermas. For O'Neill, Rawls and Habermas attend almost exclusively to issues of democratic participation, rather than to questions of rational justification. In contrast, Kant's understanding of public reason is supposedly sets forth principles we must follow in order to be engaged in public reason-giving at all. Not surprisingly, these norms are ones of "law-likeness" and "universality in scope" for such a use of reason to be truly public or autonomous (i.e., not assuming any particular kind of authority). For O'Neill, the Categorical Imperative turns out to be the constitutive principle not just of morality, but of any truly free exercise of thought, practical or theoretical.

The third section takes up questions of social and political philosophy. It begins with Gerald Gaus' "Private and Public Conscience." Here Gaus considers the question of whether an individual should abide by the dictates of her own conscience when they conflict with the demands of a public authority. Like Hill, Gaus defends a Kantian conception of conscience as a power of monitoring our first-order moral judgments, to check if they have been made with due diligence and proper consideration of our core values as well as the views of others. However, Gaus argues that Hill has understood the Kantian conception of conscience in an overly "personal" way, and argues that the better interpretation of Kant is a more inclusive model. The inclusive interpretation differs from the personal in that on the inclusive reading, conscience includes our general reasons for recognizing and abiding by a common authority even when disagree with it. Supposedly, this interpretation supports the appealing principle that people should never violate their consciences, and does so without having wholly anarchistic consequences, since a concern for the maintenance of public norms and authorities is already built into the structure of such a conscience. Gaus then considers the question of how we should deal with reasonable disagreement between our consciences. The result is a conception of conscience as a multi-stage review process. It first attends to considerations prior to the interest in a public authority (as if it were a lone "Kantian" legislator); then it reconsider these decisions in light of the needs and benefits of a public authority; and then it comes to a final judgment by asking which of these principles could be shared by diverse (but reasonable) inclusive consciences fully exercising due diligence.

Jeffrie G. Murphy's contribution turns to some of the more neglected (and embarrassing) features of Kant's philosophy of punishment. In "Kant on Three Defenses in the Law of Homicide," he considers three puzzling exceptions that Kant allows to his claim that murder must be punished by death. The first two, that of an unwed mother killing her infant and of an officer killing in a duel, are supposedly motivated by honor. The third case, involving victims of a shipwreck fighting over a plank, is found in Kant's discussion of the so-called "right of necessity." Murphy finds Kant's arguments in the honor-killing cases to range from the imbecilic to at the highly implausible, challenging Kant's claims that the law cannot help remove the stigma of shame, as well as Kant's contention that such people stand in a state-of-nature with respect to their honor. With regard to the right of necessity cases, Murphy again finds Kant's reasoning unpersuasive, relying as it does on the assumption that the law can motivate only through fear of punishment. For Murphy, these cases all show Kant to be only beginning to recognize the distinction between a defense of justification and one of mere excuse.

In "Virtue, Repugnance, and Deontology" Matt Zwolinski and David Schmidtz revisit a common theme in the virtue ethics literature: that act-centered theories, be they either consequentialist or deontological, need to be supplemented by an independent focus on ideals of character. They focus on the "repugnant conclusions" that Parfit holds to follow from conceptions of utilitarianism that would have us maximize either total or average utility. Zwolinski and Schmidtz argue that the problem of these repugnant conclusions afflicts not only fully consequentialist theories, but also any theory that allows consequences to be morally significant, thereby catching many deontological views as well. Supposedly, the remedy for such repugnant conclusions is to be found not in the further articulation of act-centered principles, but by turning to the question of "what sort of person" could endorse those conclusions. Unfortunately, this paper seems to operate with a caricature of deontology often found in the virtue ethics literature, a deontology that insists on simple, absolute rules framed almost entirely in terms of rights or interests, whose only representative is the Kant of the Groundwork. The paper also invites the question of whether a turn to character in this way may merely be moralizing our aesthetic preferences, and so claiming an unearned objectivity for them.

The section concludes with Cheshire Calhoun's intriguing "But What About the Animals?" Calhoun considers the perennially vexing question of the moral status of animals for Kant, with a focus on those, such as horses and dogs, that we have integrated into our social worlds. She helpfully reframes the issue of the moral significance of animals around the question whether we should feel grateful to animals that have done us long service. She argues that even though Kantian morality does not, strictly speaking, require us to show gratitude to such animals, nevertheless to do so is part of an admirably generous spirit of fulfilling the demands of morality. After all, we take what seems to be the morally significant behavior of other people at face value, even though there is always the possibility that they are acting on some nefarious hidden motive. Similarly, Calhoun contends that a morally generous spirit will give animals the "benefit of the doubt" with regard to behavior that seems to warrant gratitude or respect.

The final section turns to more specific issues of Kant interpretation. In "The Supererogatory and Kant's Imperfect Duties" Marcia Baron reconsiders Hill's attempts to accommodate the category of the supererogatory within Kant's imperfect duties. As Baron reads Hill, imperfect duties are such that we are only required to fulfill them to a certain (admittedly, indeterminate) extent, such that any further actions of this type count as beyond the call of duty; that is, as something morally good but not morally required. Baron contends that to understand imperfect duty this way is to treat it as something like a code for distributing a common burden as might be found in a household or club, where each person must do her share but need do no more. Baron finds this sort of thinking alien to Kant; while she allows that efforts that one has made for beneficence in the past have some bearing on how important further acts of beneficence are, so too do indefinitely many other considerations. Supposedly, the model of being obligated to only do one's fair share (or some other sort of minimum) is overly simplified, leaving out other ways in which the duty to help can be especially compelling regardless of how much one has helped in the past.

In "Did Kant Hold that Rational Volition is sub Ratione Boni?" Andrews Reath reads Kant as holding a modified version of the rationalist/cognitivist thesis that all willing is "under the guise of the good." Although Kant seems committed to this thesis in his arguments for the moral law, he also recognizes the possibility of knowing violations of that law. To make sense of such transgressions, Reath makes a compelling argument that all willing proceeds under the assumption that it is universalizable in some sense, but that this sense need not be moral, but could be merely instrumental or prudential. Although all action holds itself to some standard of universalizability, it may fall short due to various sorts of errors that the agent may make, even though such failure remains free and imputable.

Julia Driver's "Kantian Complicity" considers how Kant's ethics are better poised than consequentialist theories to make sense of the phenomenon of moral complicity, which often does not require a person to make any causal difference to a situation at all. The essay offers a subtle and detailed taxonomy of complicity that will be of interest even to those with little investment in Kant. Most interesting is Driver's account of "tolerance" or "bystander" complicity, which she sees as essentially a lack of integrity found in the failure to stand or speak up for one's values, in effect allowing oneself to be used for purposes that one does not share or even approve of.

The book concludes with Tom Hill's reflections on his philosophical biography and his responses to some of the issues raised in the preceding papers. Not surprisingly, this essay is marked by the clarity, charity, and good sense that are among the hallmarks of his work. Hill observes that rather than produce a systematic theory, he decided to address more specific issues not merely as a kind of applied moral philosophy, but as a way exploring and motivating central theoretical concerns through specific contexts. These fourteen excellent essays show just how profitable such an approach can be. The result is a first-rate collection that will be an invaluable resource not merely for students of Hill, but anyone concerned with Kantian ethics, moral psychology, or social philosophy.