Reasonableness and Fairness: A Historical Theory

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Christopher McMahon, Reasonableness and Fairness: A Historical Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 252pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781107177178.

Reviewed by Judith Lynn Failer, Indiana University, Bloomington


In an era of deep political and social cleavages, it has become a commonplace to lament that our inability to talk to each other has begun to erode our democracies. After all, if we cannot learn from each other what we need, how can we craft appropriate programs? Christopher McMahon offers a theory that forms the foundation necessary to address that question. His stated goal is to understand what is happening when people who are trying to coordinate activities make competently reasoned judgments about what is reasonable and fair. To that end, he provides a normative theory that describes that process and its prerequisites, and shows how it works in terms of political cooperation. He also adds a descriptive component to his argument by tracing how people have understood the concepts differently over time.

This is actually a metatheory in that it focuses on the preconditions necessary for those deliberations, and on the motivations people need to make reasonable concessions therein. He does not advocate any particular view about how people should negotiate or what reasonable or fair outcome we should reach on any specific topic. Rather, the book makes a strong case for the motivations people should have when establishing decision-making mechanisms and rules for when they attempt to coordinate, and again for the motivations that should drive them when they follow whichever guidelines they ultimately choose. If we are able to follow these meta-guidelines, then we will be able to achieve reasonable and fair outcomes, initial cleavages notwithstanding.

Although this is a generally applicable theory about reasonableness and fairness in any kind of coordinated activity, its practical advantage is that it addresses a central problem in political philosophy: What are the preconditions necessary for the pursuit of reasonable and fair policies aimed at the public good? Insofar as John Rawls can help tell us understand the content of justice as fairness, McMahon provides us with the logically prior conditions necessary to make that Rawlsian determination.

Here's how it works. Assume that people want to pursue the public good, but this requires political cooperation since people disagree about which policies are best at achieving that end. They decide to cooperate, knowing that at least some of them will need to make concessions in order to reach a reasonable and fair outcome. But before they can discuss the policies, they need to create rules and processes for having the discussion itself. This is where reasonableness first comes into play. When people are being reasonable during the rule-creating stage, they are willing to make concessions from their initial beliefs about how the coordination should proceed, as long as others are willing to make concessions, too. Then, and again after the procedures are established, their sense of fairness requires that they reduce and/or eliminate disparities in the concessions people need to make in order to reach their goals.

What is most interesting about McMahon's approach is that we can actually create reasonable and fair outcomes, even though the theory does not dictate what these outcomes should look like. This can happen if participants are motivated by these concepts when they judge both the process's structure and implementation. In other words, the theory cannot not tell us ahead of time which processes are reasonable or which outcomes are fair. But, if we are motivated to make concessions in order to remove perceived inequalities, then the theory tells us that we will end up with a reasonable and fair outcome -- whatever particular form that might take. As he writes, "The theory has the consequence that when we employ these concepts correctly in judgment, we create the facts of reasonableness and fairness that the judgments record" (p. 5). In order for this to work, people need to be motivated to make concessions when they perceive unfairness, and in the obverse, they need to be motivated not to make concessions when they perceive that things are already fair. But with these presuppositions in place, we can both employ and achieve reasonableness and fairness.

Focusing on the metatheory of judging what counts as reasonable and fair has important advantages. First, it recognizes and honors the fact that people disagree about the best way to pursue the common good. If the theory were to merely give us a heuristic for evaluating the reasonableness or fairness of a given policy, it would run the risk of being off-putting to those who disagree. But by involving people in judging the reasonableness and fairness of the decision-making process itself, the theory adds a layer of democratic legitimacy to the outcome.

Second, we need not presuppose the desired conclusion of public deliberations, but rather permit those deliberations to work according to whichever methods the participants deem reasonable and fair. This is key because people come to deliberations from competing perspectives about which policies they should pursue, and this feeds into the divisive politics that characterize contemporary politics. But it may be easier to achieve agreement on the decision-making scheme itself, especially if people approach it from a position of reasonableness. And once the scheme is agreed to, the ensuing result may be able to breach their deep divides.

Third, and most significantly, it provides us with a theoretical explanation of how and why we have reasonable disagreements. To begin, since the outcomes are not predetermined, groups of reasonable and fair-minded decision-makers may create different mechanisms for making decisions about how to pursue the good. At the very least, in a morally diverse society, it should not surprise us that once these different mechanisms are in place, different groups may well reach alternative conclusions about which policies to use when pursuing the public good.

On a deeper level, McMahon shows us how these judgments not only vary at any given time, but also change across time. This happens because people learn to judge reasonableness and fairness when they are children. The content of these lessons come from their families, presumably, but also can be reshaped from time to time by the particular conceptions of these ideas that pervade their polity and even larger political milieu. (Of course, the families' views likely reflect these prominent conceptions as well.) What counts as an inequity in need of remedy changes over time, however. Excluding slaves from the polity may have been acceptable at one time, but it is no longer so. Similarly, judgments about who qualifies to make decisions about public good used to -- but no longer -- exclude women. Because baseline judgments about fairness and reasonableness change over time, it should come as no surprise that people make different judgments at different times in history.

Once McMahon establishes that conceptions of reasonableness and fairness change over time, he is able to conclude the book with an analysis of that evolution from pre-liberal theories through the Enlightenment. This part of the book is more explanatory and descriptive than normative, and shows how his theoretical framework can account for three important times in the history of ideas. In this regard, his arguments seem to echo those of Quentin Skinner, but they operate at a higher level of abstraction. They also focus more on political morality and how it can affect politics, rather than Skinner's emphasis on the history of political thought.

Alas, this part of the analysis is very quick. The points he makes here are fascinating, and I wish there were more. The author contends that "conceptual change and social change reciprocally condition one another" (p. 218), but given how much of the argument is devoted to building up to the point there the reader can appreciate more fully how this can happen, it would have been nice to illustrate the point with a longer and richer history of the evolution of these ideas. Right now, he documents this change by citing historians of ideas, in particular Quentin Skinner and Steve Pincus. But the argument might also benefit from discussion of the primary sources themselves, e.g., Locke, Rousseau, and their contemporaries. Another way to enrich the discussion would be to continue the history past the Glorious Revolution. Tracing American ideas of reasonableness and fairness would also be interesting, for example, especially since it could help clarify the foundational challenges we now face in our divisive politics. Regardless, the book is sufficiently rich as it is, and other scholars may decide to pick up his mantle from here.

Overall, the book is carefully conceived, tightly written, and provides a creative explanation to several old conundrums in political and moral theory: How should we approach making decisions about pursuing the public good? How can we create legitimate policies when we are comprised of people who hold such profoundly different values?

In the end, I suspect McMahon is more of an optimist than I am. The political and moral cleavages that seem to divide our current political lives seem so deep, that I'm not sure whether there is sufficient agreement about what counts as a reasonable judgment about rules let alone a sense of fairness that would require us to accept the same outcomes. And without a sufficiently broad commitment to judge decision-rules according to shared standards of reasonableness, I suspect the hope for legitimate policy choices amongst such divisiveness will remain elusive. As normative theory, however, this book clearly points us in the right direction.